Logical Pluralism

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J.C.Beall and Greg Restall, Logical Pluralism, Clarendon Press, 2006, 143pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199288402, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199288410.

Reviewed by Stephen Read, University of St. Andrews


It is generally recognised that there are many logics: classical logic, intuitionistic logic, relevance logics (several of these), linear logic(s), connexive logic(s), higher-order logics, traditional or Aristotelian logic, modal logics, tense (or temporal) logics, many-valued logics, and so on. What makes them all logics is more contentious: a popular answer of late has been that they all identify a concept of logical consequence, perhaps satisfying certain minimal constraints (or at least, some family resemblance). Again, it is generally recognised that different logics suit different purposes: propositional (or zero-order) logic can establish the validity of certain forms of reasoning, while first-order logic is needed to capture other inference patterns; epistemic or deontic logics give insight into specific features of reasoning about knowledge and norms; and so on. Here the logics are based on different languages, and a different consequence relation suits each. Beall and Restall call this "Carnapian tolerance’’: "for Carnap, the choice of language is unconstrained … The resulting logics are different because the languages are different’’ (p.78).

Carnap’s pluralism is not that of Beall and Restall. Theirs is again more contentious. It is not all-embracing: certain logics are rejected. But in essence, their pluralism identifies a generic concept of logical consequence and allows any specification within that genus to count as equally good. "There is no sense in asking which is the correct account’’ (p.29). Classical logic, intuitionistic logic, paraconsistent logic all provide admissible "precisifications’’ of the informal notion of following from.

That generic notion of consequence is captured in the Generalised Tarski Thesis (GTT): "An argument is valid if and only if, in every case in which the premises are true, so is the conclusion.’’ (p. 29)

The many different logics are then captured by specifying what is to count as a "case”. The analogy is with the Leibnizian account of necessity (p. 26): "a claim is necessarily true if and only if it is true in every case.‘’ Different specifications of ’case’ yield, e.g., metaphysical necessity, physical necessity, historical necessity and so on. All and only logics which derive from a specification of ‘case’ in GTT are ‘admissible precisifications’ of the informal notion of logical consequence, say Beall and Restall. For example, classical logic results from taking cases to be Tarskian models, i.e., a non-empty domain D and an interpretation of the language over D; intuitionistic validity is the result of taking cases to be constructions or stages — incomplete but consistent "states of knowledge’’ or "warrants’’; paraconsistent logic results from allowing cases to be inconsistent, that is, allowing a case to make both A and ~A true (and B false), in order to invalidate "explosion’’, for example, the inference of B from (A~A); free logic is the result of allowing D to be empty; and so on.

In Part III, the authors consider a number of objections that have been raised to their presentation of pluralism in earlier articles. Perhaps the foremost of these was put by Graham Priest in his paper ‘Logic: one or many?’ (which is cited in Logical Pluralism from a 1999 typescript, but in fact appeared in Logical Consequences, ed. B. Brown and J. Woods, Hermes 2001; a revised version appears as ch. 12 of Doubt Truth to be a Liar, Clarendon Press 2005). Suppose that the argument from α to β is classically but not relevantly valid (p. 93), and suppose α is (known to be) true. "Are we, or are we not, entitled to accept β?‘’, Priest asked. Beall and Restall reply: "If α is true in [world] s … then, by the [classical] validity of the inference from α to β, it follows that β is true in s. That is not at issue. The pluralism in our position comes from the plurality of relations of logical consequence, not any plurality about what is the case.’’ (loc.cit.)

Beall and Restall are not relativists about truth, so they mean that the truth of β is not at issue. But does that leave any opening for an issue about whether to infer β from α?

Consider the authors’ discussion (p. 70) of the relevantly (and intuitionistically) invalid inference AB~B. They write: "the conclusion, although true, and true of necessity, is not true in every situation in which A is true.’’ Necessary truth is truth in all worlds, that is, complete and consistent situations. B~B is true in all of those. But in an incomplete situation, A could be true and B~B false. If all we know is that A is true, we do not know if the situation is complete or not: "the truth of A does not bring with it the truth of B~B; it comes along in some other way.”

The authors distinguish four views of the semantics of paraconsistency (p. 80): the "gentlest’’, mere rejection of explosion (A~AB) leads to "full-strength paraconsistency’’, the belief that there are interesting inconsistent and non-trivial theories; but against Priest’s slippery-slope argument, they claim that their pluralism allows them to halt the slide into "industrial-strength paraconsistency’’, the belief that some such theory may be true, and so stop well short of dialetheism itself, the belief that some such theory is true. They do so by invoking explosion (rejected paraconsistently, but endorsed, in pluralist mode, classically): find some B which one rejects, and so reject A~A by modus tollens, for all A (p. 81).

Taking a cue from this, one might reason: find some A which one accepts, and invoke the classical inference of B~B from A to conclude that B~B is also true, for all B. Thus the situation we are in, s, whatever it is, must be consistent and complete. Applied to Priest’s challenge: given that α is true in s, and that β follows classically from α, β must be true. Classical validity trumps any other account of validity.

Not all of the discussion focusses on paraconsistency and relevance. Consider the ω-rule, for example (p. 99), to infer (n)A(n) from the infinity of premises A(0), … . This is first-order invalid, but valid in second-order logic. Beall and Restall claim that "first-order counterexamples tell us something important about the transitions made from premises to conclusions in those arguments; and the first-order invalidity of those arguments is a genuine invalidity.’’ Those counterexamples depend on the existence of non-standard models of arithmetic, models containing a whole infinity of numbers distinct from, and in fact greater than, the standard natural numbers. But there are no such numbers; the models serve only to show the expressive limitation of first-order induction. It is a weakness of first-order arithmetic that it is not categorical. There are advantages to working in a first-order language, which lead one to accept its inadequacies. But that is what they are: the ω-rule is first-order invalid but genuinely valid, since (n)A(n) is true whenever A(n) is true for every n.

Priest’s challenge asks whether we should, or should not, infer β from α, given that β follows from α according to logic 1 but not according to logic 2. But what if ~β follows from α according to logic 3? Should we infer β or ~β (or both)? Beall and Restall consider such a case (p. 117): intuitionistic mathematics is not simply weaker than classical mathematics; it rejects some classical results as outright false. This cannot always be dismissed as a case of proving that one cannot prove a classical result. When it cannot, Beall and Restall are forced by their pluralism to reject the reasoning. The reasoning is true of constructions — incomplete situations. But it is not true in fact (p. 119).

This case highlights what was perhaps already clear. Pluralism fails to appreciate the full force of alternative logics. Those logics not only provide an alternative to classical logic: in addition, they reject classical (or orthodox) logic. They are heterodox in a way which pluralism in its irenic generosity cannot accommodate. Elsewhere, I have attributed this eclecticism to the use of "Gentile semantics’’ (in `Monism: the one true logic’, in The Logical Approach to Philosophy, ed. D. DeVidi and T. Kenyon, Springer 2006). No self-respecting constructivist would endorse a model-theoretic account of consequence: Kripke semantics was a way for classical thinkers to apply classical model theory to intuitionistic logic (and perhaps thereby to think they understood it). Similarly, the advocates of relevance logic responded to the challenge that their logic was inadequate in lacking a model theory by adapting Kripke’s techniques: as Meyer put it, with conscious Biblical allusion, he and the other inventors of the semantics of relevance logic "preached to the Gentiles in their own tongue’’, classical model theory.

Reasoning in logic 1 (model theory) about logic 2 is fated to produce a multiple personality — in the long run, pluralism, when one does the same for logics 3, 4, … . It briefly leads Beall and Restall (p. 100) to suggest that relevance logic should reject Excluded Middle since it is not true in every situation. This recalls the effect on pronunciation which learning to read has on the illiterate: they start to question and even change their perfectly correct speech. Logic fails in non-normal situations, which is why there cannot be such situations; they are a figment of the classical model theory. That is no reason to abandon Excluded Middle, or the Law of Non-Contradiction for that matter.

Logical Pluralism presents a challenge to the proponents of alternative logic, and even to classical logicians who find alternative logics interestingly mistaken. In a short book, the authors not only raise deep issues, they also provide neat thumbnail sketches of a range of logics. It is clear from my response that I think their position is mistaken, but theirs is a challenge that must be met, and meeting it adequately is not easy. Every logician should read this book.