Logicism and its Philosophical Legacy

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William Demopoulos, Logicism and its Philosophical Legacy, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 281pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107029804.

Reviewed by James Pearson, Bridgewater State University


These eleven essays by William Demopoulos will primarily interest specialists in the philosophy of science, the philosophy of mathematics, and the history of analytic philosophy. Three are new, and another three appeared as recently as 2011. Unlike other collections which provide an overview of their author's major ideas over the course of a career, this one also contributes to current scholarship. Demopoulos mines the work of Frege, Russell, Carnap, and Ramsey to argue that attending to the history of logicism (understood broadly as the use of logical analysis to reveal what is distinctive about arithmetical knowledge) grants empiricists a deeper understanding of how to view the epistemic character of different parts of their theories.

Yet since the title promises an account of a historical movement and its legacy, it is surprising to read that these essays are neither "scholarly historical studies" (1) nor "interpretations" of the major logicists (30). Demopoulos instead favors "reconstructions," which are free to depart (sometimes radically) from particular logicists' "actual historical development," so that he may explore "more satisfactory alternatives" (30). This method is acceptable when Demopoulos endorses a reconstructed view (as in his own Carnapian neutrality to metaphysics), but becomes uncharitable when he challenges one (as in his distaste for the phenomenalism he attributes to Ramsey). Worse is that reconstructionism participates in the misconception that we can sharply divide philosophy from its history, a view that I think harms our appreciation of both. Shying away from the label "historian" seems to be Demopoulos' way of preempting a critic who is given to dry, nitpicking textual interpretation for its own sake. He cares about the view, not who may or may not have held it. But the critic Demopoulos imagines is surely a bogeyman. Historians of philosophy are those who recognize that philosophy involves bringing the ideas of earlier figures -- however recent -- into dialogue with our own (which often necessitates close reading), carefully evaluating their successes and failures, and revealing what we still have to learn and do. I think that, in spite of himself, Demopoulos goes a considerable way to accomplishing these goals, but readers should in any event be prepared for essays that focus on examining what logicism might have been (and thereby, why it remains interesting), not what logicism was.

In this review, I shall focus on the first seven essays, which are linked by two major topics (the remaining essays seem to me less thematically unified): the epistemological significance of fundamental identity criteria (essays 1-4) and the rejection of structuralism (essays 5-7). The book is front-loaded with Demopoulos' new material, but to provide some context for readers unfamiliar with his ideas I shall begin with his older work.

In the fifth and perhaps best known essay, written with Michael Friedman, Demopoulos rediscovers M.H.A. Newman's objection to Russell's structuralism. In the two subsequent essays he examines different accounts of theoretical knowledge in light of the work that this landmark paper generated. While in 1985 Demopoulos and Friedman could write that Newman's objection was "not as well known as it deserves to be" (96), by 2011 it had become a "well-known criticism of Russell's theory" (149), in no small part because of their earlier effort. Yet Demopoulos urges here that its scope has still not been fully appreciated. In his view, Newman's objection exposes that any view which hopes to explain our knowledge of the non-observational part of our theories by arguing that the content of this knowledge can be reconstructed purely logically is flawed. Thus he claims that it refutes not only Russell's, Ramsey's, and Carnap's versions of structuralism, but also, when rephrased model-theoretically, Bas van Fraassen's constructive empiricism.

In The Analysis of Matter (1927)Russell argued that knowledge of things beyond our acquaintance is wholly structural, and thus, as Demopoulos reconstructs him, that the Ramsey sentence of a theory (the result of existentially generalizing away all of its theoretical terms) captures its factual content. Demopoulos shows this thesis was necessary to drive home Russell's earlier criticism of Berkeley's idealism: though we are not acquainted with the material world, we nevertheless have (structural) knowledge of it. However, he unfairly makes Russell appear foolish by objecting that, since this structural knowledge results from defining an isomorphism between the accessible world of percepts and the inaccessible material world, it is not "significant" (113-115). But Russell does not merely stipulate the existence of the isomorphism. He argues for its existence on the basis of more or less plausible assumptions (e.g., that physical events cause precepts and that causation is a spatiotemporally continuous relation).[1] At any rate, Newman's objection to this proposal is now widely thought fatal: since it can be proved that any given structure is definable upon a set of objects, provided only that there are enough of them, knowledge of structure reduces to a nearly trivial cardinality claim. Russell's proposal is thus plainly inadequate as an account of our substantive knowledge of physics.

Beyond his anachronistic use of Ramsey sentences (the import of which he elegantly extracts via a comparison with Craig transcriptions [142-146]) to articulate the commitments of Russell's structuralism, Demopoulos offers a phenomenalist reconstruction of Ramsey's remarks in "Theories" to provide a striking antirealist contrast to Russell's realism. This enables him to draw out some important philosophical implications of the technical contrast between extensions and expansions (151-153). Demopoulos makes these points using a "toy theory" T which has true observational consequences in the standard model of the natural numbers, but which is only true in nonstandard models. While the standard model cannot be expanded to a model of T, it has an extension that is a model of T -- roughly, achieved by adding additional elements to its domain. Whereas extensions of the domain of observational consequences (and so, theories that can be modeled only in such extensions) are licensed under Russell's realist structuralism (since its point is to show how we can extend our knowledge beyond percepts to things existing in the material world), Demopoulos maintains that they are ontologically extravagant under Ramsey's antirealist structuralism.

Demopoulos enlists Carnap to help clear an attractive middle ground, emphasizing his passing remark that the theoretical entities to which the Ramsey sentence of a theory refer are "purely logico-mathematical."[2] Unlike Ramsey, Demopoulos suggests, Carnap allows for theories that are true only in extensions of the domain of observational consequences, but, unlike Russell, he takes the entities thus admitted to be understandable using only the language in which the theory is formulated. Nevertheless, Demopoulos contends that, in taking the Ramsey sentence of a theory to capture its factual content, Carnap's structuralism (and, mutatis mutandis, van Fraassen's constructive empiricism) falls to Newman's objection. For if a theory's theoretical vocabulary is only fixed up to its logical category, Demopoulos proves that it can be interpreted in an arbitrary model of the right cardinality. The upshot is that the non-observational part of a theory is trivialized, being true "as a matter of metalogic," not as a matter of the world being a certain way (125).

Demopoulos deploys variations of this core insight repeatedly in the essays critiquing structuralism. Some repetition is of course to be expected in collections where a view is being refined over several decades. (Readers will find similar discussions of the toy theory in essays four and seven, and of Frege's logicism in essays one, eight, and nine.) While specialists may find it valuable to work through Demopoulos' refinements, framed as they are against the developing literature on Newman's objection, others should focus on his view's culmination in essay seven, "Three Views of Theoretical Knowledge." Here, he also turns from his largely negative crusade to recommending Anil Gupta's recent work as a viable framework for an empiricist theory of theories. Having diagnosed structuralism's problem not as the empiricists' distinction between the observational and theoretical parts of our theories, but as the suggestion that the observational part is, in some sense, better grounded or fixed by our ongoing experience than the theoretical part, Demopoulos praises Gupta's proposal to treat the contribution of experience to both parts evenly. On Gupta's view, experience does not yield epistemically privileged observational propositions (even ones capable of being rationally rejected, as naturalists following Quine might say) but hypothetical entitlements to further beliefs given one's current view. Accordingly, an account of rationality should explain which outlook an agent ought to adopt having contemplated the features of the various belief revision sequences licensed by her experiences. This appealing proposal, informed as it is by Gupta and Nuel Belnap's technical machinery on revision rules, and like the structuralist tradition Demopoulos usefully sets it against, demonstrates the value of employing logical methods in epistemological investigations.

Demopoulos and Friedman end their 1985 essay with a conjecture that Newman's problem reveals logicism incapable of simultaneously capturing the "distinctive character" of pure and applied mathematics (107). In the new and provocative essays on the epistemic significance of fundamental identity criteria that open the book, Demopoulos argues against this conjecture.

Demopoulos begins his argument with a thought-provoking reconstruction of the goal of Frege's logicism. Frege gives rigorous gap-free derivations of arithmetical theorems not to solidify their justification but to establish that their proof does not require an appeal to spatial or temporal intuition. This point is not new, but Demopoulos argues that a Fregean could build upon it to answer "the problem of apriority," namely, how, without invoking Frege's inconsistent theory of extensions, the justification for arithmetical truths can be shown to depend only on general laws (17). Demopoulos' idea is to distinguish Frege's argument for and use of Hume's principle as the criterion of identity for number from his logicist argument for the existence of logical objects to be identified with the numbers. Since Hume's principle is not logical but arithmetical, it cannot serve Frege's logicist argument. However, its generality (in mentioning no objects) makes it an appropriate ground for arithmetic's apriority, and Frege shows how to use it to derive the Dedekind infinity of the natural numbers.

The key insight Demopoulos finds here, and which underwrites the following three essays, is that Frege "effects an account of the basic laws of pure arithmetic that reveals their basis in the principle which controls the applications we make of the numbers in our cardinality judgments" (19). Since the cardinality operator acts on concepts, Demopoulos takes Frege to reveal a "basis . . . for characteristically arithmetical modes of reasoning in general reasoning, and therefore in conceptual thought itself" (26). But -- pursuing now my own line rather than Demopoulos' -- I would say that the converse is also true: Frege shows that conceptual thought requires arithmetical reasoning. If one tries to deny an arithmetical law, he tells us, "even to think at all seems no longer possible."[3] The reason, I think, is that Frege's quantificational analysis of generality shows how widespread quantificational inferences are in everyday inquiry, and presupposes the existence of discrete objects being generalized over. But our grip upon discreteness is predicated upon our arithmetical ability to count different objects as distinct numerical identities. If we cannot count, we cannot reason. To my mind, then, Frege shows us just how intimate the relationship between logico-mathematical ability and conceptual thought is.

In the second essay, Demopoulos considers Carnap's claim that "certain applied mathematical theories are not factual" (28). Rather than judging it based on a Tractarian view that logico-mathematical statements are tautologous, Demopoulos' suggestion is to view it through an Einsteinian lens, as a "methodological analysis of the application of mathematical theories in science" (33). He argues that Einstein showed that the basic criteria of identity for applied geometric theories of space-time, congruence and simultaneity, are established experimentally, and so, are empirically constrained by the principles governing the movement of practically rigid bodies and the transmission of light signals respectively. In contrast, essay one showed Frege's principle of equinumerosity to be entirely general, requiring no experimental results.

Here, then, we find the reason for Demopoulos' rejection of his earlier conjecture: logicists can account for the different epistemic character of applied and pure mathematics, by illuminating the way that the basic identity principles grounding applications of geometry are empirically constrained in a way that those grounding applications of arithmetic are not. This is a very interesting suggestion, not least because Demopoulos, contributing to the recent surge of interest in Carnap and Quine, claims (though without much in the way of argument) that it gives an epistemologically grounded reason for preferring some sort of analytic-synthetic distinction in the reconstruction of scientific theories to Quine's holistic notion of centrality. Demopoulos' thought seems to be that we need a non-contingent way of recording the difference in kind he has unearthed between differing mathematical applications. But since the Einsteinian results on which he builds may be rejected in the course of our ongoing scientific inquiry, I suspect that the contingency of centrality will remain appealing to Quineans.

In the following two chapters, Demopoulos develops a modified Carnapian approach to the realism/instrumentalism debate. He begins by offering a nuanced reading of Carnap's internal/external distinction which he uses to disarm the objection, recently advanced by Penelope Maddy, that the distinction returns the wrong answer in the case of the atomic hypothesis (which was vindicated by experimentation rather than pragmatically accepted). In Demopoulos' view, the pragmatic, external choice is not about whether to admit the existence of atoms, but rather, having endorsed a theory whose factual content is given by a Ramsey sentence that existentially quantifies over unobservable entities, whether to adopt an instrumentalist interpretation which views the theory as a sophisticated mathematical apparatus for prediction or a realist interpretation which views the theory as describing reality beyond what we can observe. Although textual evidence suggests that this is "very likely not [Carnap's own] account" (66) -- a judgment with which I certainly concur -- Demopoulos deftly displays advantages of his reconstruction to readers with Carnapian sympathies. However, in his own view (reached after an updated argument against van Fraassen's empiricist structuralism[4]) giving up the structuralist thesis allows us to combine an appealing Carnapian neutrality to ontological questions with an innocent realism that respects the intuitive difference between truth and warranted assertion.

Let me close by briefly addressing the final essays. The eighth expands Demopoulos' reconstruction of Frege's logicism, and forms the background to the ninth's evaluation of Frege's legacy in light of subsequent mathematical achievements (which I think would work quite well in early analytic philosophy courses). The tenth offers a surprising reconstruction of Russell's no-class theory of classes that actually assumes classes in order to explain the motivation for the ramified theory of types. This motivation, according to Demopoulos, is epistemological: a Russellian could use it to explain our knowledge of classes not known directly by a predicative function so long as those classes are composed of predicative functions (analogously to the way that things can be known by description if their constituents are known by acquaintance). The final essay interestingly demonstrates that, in infinite domains, an analysis of Ramsey's notion of an extensional propositional function can be used to derive a tautology that shows the truth of an axiom of infinity.

Despite my occasional points of disagreement with these essays, and although I would emphasize different aspects of Frege's legacy in particular, I certainly recommend this stimulating collection. Demopoulos' critical engagement with Ramsey's dense and sometimes neglected opus, as well as his new work on the significance of fundamental identity criteria, makes this book an important contribution. Although generalists will not find all of the essays accessible, at his best Demopoulos demonstrates an impressive ability to draw out the philosophical importance of technical results. Such passages serve as a model for those of us interested in finding a broader philosophical audience for formal work.

[1] For more, see the discussion in the fifth section of Stathis Psillos, "Ramsey's Ramsey-sentences," in Maria Galavotti (ed.), Cambridge and Vienna: Frank P. Ramsey and the Vienna Circle, Dordrecht: Springer, 2006.

[2] Carnap, "Replies and systematic expositions," in P. A. Schlipp (ed.) The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap, La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1963, 963.

[3] Frege, The Foundations of Arithmetic, Trans. J. L. Austin, Second ed., Oxford: Blackwell, 1980, §14.

[4] Developed recently in van Fraassen, Scientific Representation: Paradoxes of Perspective, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008.