If it is reasonable to hope that the current moment in philosophy may ultimately represent one of transition, from the divided remnants of the still enduring “split” between “analytic” and “continental” philosophy to some form (or forms) of twenty-first century philosophy that is no longer recognizably either (or is both), it seems likely as well that the thought and work of Alain Badiou can play a key role in articulating this much needed transition. One of the central innovations of Badiou’s work is that it uses the kind of rigorous formalism characteristic of much good analytic philosophy in its attempt to think through some of the main problems of ontology, metaphysics and political theory that have troubled continental philosophers over the course of the twentieth century. Both in Badiou’s 1988 magnum opus, Being and Event and its new sequel, Logics of Worlds, the result is a kind of paradoxical formalism of the limits of formalism itself, striking a sometimes uneasy balance between the inveterate tendency of analytic thought to seek formal solutions for theoretical problems of epistemology and metaphysics, and that of continental thought to seek the solution to what are seen as more-than-theoretical problems of social and political praxis in the kinds of liberation that may occur outside the “closed” regime of all that is calculable or tractable by formal systems.1
In Logics of Worlds, as in the earlier book, Badiou’s overriding aim is to theorize the possibility of radical novelty, or of discontinuous and essentially unforeseeable change, in any of a variety of domains (chiefly those of the “four generic procedures”: politics, art, science, and love). To this end, in Being and Event, Badiou developed an elaborate and innovative theory of formal ontology based on mathematical structures, in particular that of mathematical set theory on its standard, ZFC axiomatization. This allowed Badiou to theorize what he there called the “event”, the paradoxical occurrence that, by locally suspending the fundamental axioms normally governing the appearance of any object or entity as such, allows essentially new groupings, indiscernible by means of the resources of the existing situation, suddenly to appear and work their transformative effects.2 In Logics of Worlds, Badiou supplements this earlier “ontological” account of evental change with a comprehensive formal theory of appearance, what Badiou here terms a “phenomenology”. Although the underlying apparatus is once again drawn from mathematical formalism, the sociopolitical implications of such possibilities of change are also, once again, very much to the fore. Indeed, in its “Preface”, Badiou presents the whole argument of Logics of Worlds as part of an attempt to theorize what escapes the assumptions of contemporary “natural belief”, what he sees as the confining dogmas of postmodern relativism and conventionalism (pp. 2-3). Such views, Badiou thinks, can ultimately yield only a monotonous regime of “democratic materialism” that, in seeing all cultures and their claims as on a level, forecloses both any possibility of real development and any effective intervention to produce fundamental change (pp. 2-8). Badiou proposes to replace this axiomatic of contemporary conviction with one that he calls, following Althusser, a “materialist dialectic”. The central difference here is Badiou’s unhesitating affirmation of what he calls Truths, which are, according to him, generally denied or suppressed in the contemporary orthodoxy of belief (p. 4). Badiou’s notion of truth, however, is a heterodox one, not to be understood in terms of any familiar (e.g., correspondence or coherence) notion. For Badiou, the central mark of a Truth is its capacity to break with (or “subtract itself from”) an existing regime of knowledge, and so to define a direction of radical transformation which, if followed out, will lead to the substantial re-ordering of basic possibilities of presentation and representation within the existing order (pp. 9-10). This vector of transformation is, for Badiou, always infinite. Thus the punctual articulation of a Truth by means of an evental break with a given situation is always partial, and liable to be taken up again, even after a lapse of centuries or millennia, through the renewal of a faithful tracing of the consequences of a subsequent Event by the agency of what Badiou terms the “subject” (pp. 33-35).
Much of this terminology is familiar from Being and Event‘s theory of radical, evental change, and Badiou’s aim here is not so much to alter that theory in any fundamental way as to remedy certain deficiencies he now sees in it. In particular, Being and Event described the ontological structure and conditions for the event to come about, but it failed to consider in detail the conditions governing the appearance of events in determinate, structured situations, what Badiou now terms “worlds”. This supplemental task of understanding the structuration of appearances and how they change and develop leads Badiou to various innovations and modifications of his earlier theory. Most significant here is the consideration that, whereas it is plausible that ontology is static and non-relational, the realm of appearances is inherently relational, dynamic, and variable. Accordingly, in the realm of appearances, there are degrees of existence and of “identity” between two objects, and even greater or lesser degrees of identity between an object and itself (pp. 118-140). These relations of identity and existence determine degrees of intensity of appearance, ranging from a minimal (effectively zero) degree, corresponding to complete invisibility or failure to appear, to a maximal degree of appearance, corresponding to maximal presence or effectiveness within the structured world (pp. 138-140). Badiou demonstrates these relationships in concreto by working out in detail several different examples of “worlds” and their phenomenal elements or objects in their degrees of intra-world existence: a country road at sunset, a painting by Hubert Robert, a Parisian political demonstration, and the city of Brasilia.
Whereas Being and Event theorized the overarching structure of Being (at least insofar as it is speakable) as modeled by the axioms of standard set theory, Logics of Worlds turns instead to category theory to model the domain of appearing. In general, a category can be understood as a structure of relations; the identity of the objects thus structured is irrelevant, as long as this structure of relations is preserved. Most significantly for Badiou’s project, however, it is also possible to use a special kind of categorical structures, known as topoi, to model logical ones; for instance, we can use topos theory to model algebraically all of the axioms and relations of standard, classical propositional logic.3 In fact, it is a consequence of this categorical method that the logics modeled need not be classical ones; indeed, we can use topoi to model any number of non-classical logics, including intuitionist and many-valued ones. These non-classical logics can uniformly be understood as determined by total algebraic structures called Heyting algebras (pp. 173-190).
Using this category-theoretical framework, Badiou can thus define the underlying structures determining the “logic” or relations of appearance determining what is treated as existent in each world, including various degrees of existence correspondent to the degrees of truth allowed by the world’s specific categorical architecture. He terms the specific structure determining these logical relationships and intensities of existence for a particular world its “transcendental”. Although the terminology echoes idealist theories from Kant to Husserl, Badiou emphasizes that in speaking of such structuring as “transcendental” he does not in any sense intend to give a theory of the transcendental subject. Instead, Badiou’s relationships of structuration of appearance are explicitly objective, determining without exception what can be understood to “exist” in a particular world, and what remains “inexistent” or invisible within its own particular way of structuring its phenomena (pp. 231-241). Similarly, although the employment of Heyting algebras and the multiplicity of differently structured logics suggest intuitionist or constructivist motivations, at least with respect to the realm of appearances, Badiou emphasizes that the “transcendentals” that structure worlds are not, for him, in any important sense linguistic structures. Indeed, by steadfastly avoiding describing the structuration of appearances as in any way dependent on structures within us or created by us, he aims to break entirely with all forms of idealism. Any such position, he avers, will fail to grasp the objectivity of what is phenomenal within a world, the capability of objects to appear and take on their distinctive degrees of existence without any contribution whatsoever from the “human animal”.4
Badiou is thus able to theorize (using category theory) the phenomenal structure within appearance of what are also (already according to Being and Event) thinkable (using set theory) as sets or multiplicities within being itself. This underlying identity of phenomenal objects and ontological multiplicities leads to the primary innovation of Logics of Worlds’ new theorization of evental change: the idea of a specific “retroaction” of appearance on being, whereby the fact of the phenomenal appearance of a particular (ontological) set within a structured world brings about a train of changes that will ultimately transform the transcendental structure of the world itself (p. 94, pp. 221-3). This strange retroactive effect of appearing on being is possible, as in Being and Event, only through a paradoxical effect of self-reference or
belonging; for an event to occur, it is necessary not only that a certain set (a multiple in being) be a member of itself, but also that this particular being appear, in a world, as an element of a transcendental indexing that again indexes that very being (pp. 360-61). Here, as in Being and Event, we should think of the precarious way in which a historical event, for instance, can bring into existence the very terms and signifiers that will subsequently provide terms for its own evaluation, and thus play an essential role in constituting it (given the new terms and degrees of evaluation they imply) as the event it will subsequently be visible as having been (pp. 364-66).
When this quasi-paradoxical structure of the “evental site” is present, according to Badiou, it is immediately possible for it to be taken up in a variety of different ways, corresponding to different degrees and intensities of change in the world. In the most radical case, a subject’s faithful tracing of the implications of the structure of the evental site results in the element which was formerly minimal in its degree of existence - what had earlier literally “in-existed” in that particular world, being present in its being but completely invisible to the world’s logic — suddenly to attain a maximal degree of existence, bringing with it all the changes in the existing structure that this implies (pp. 374-79). The analogy here is to the sort of political revolution in which (as an old Marxist motto runs) “we who are nothing shall be all!”; Badiou also thinks of this kind of evental change as possible in other domains, for instance in the kind of “paradigm shift” in science that not only elicits new objects and makes visible phenomena that previously escaped attention, but even fundamentally re-organizes the large-scale structure of what counts as existent in the (newly transformed) world.
Throughout all of this work, Badiou’s mathematics is uniformly rigorous and detailed. Key results and structures are derived, and throughout the book helpful and colorful examples aid the reader interested in gaining an intuitive understanding of the relevant structures of category theory and their application to determinate logics. The central gambit — the use of mathematical formalism to theorize the very definition and limits of what can appear, and thus to capture the possibility of the radically new coming to light — is certainly both interesting and innovative. However, if Logics of Worlds is to be successful in announcing the kind of transformative event of philosophical thought that Badiou would like it (along with its predecessor volume) to be, there are, it seems, at least two questions that must first be raised and answered.
The first is the question whether, for all of its rigorous and detailed formalism, Logics of Worlds actually succeeds in producing an improved understanding of those structures and relationships of “objective appearing” that are its central theoretical objects. These are, remember, not appearances-to-a-subject or even appearances as structured or determined by conventional decision or by a contingent language community, but rather “objective” appearings to no one in particular, nevertheless rigidly disjoined from the “ontological” reality of things as they are in themselves. Although Badiou offers a detailed formalism of these degrees and relations, up to the variable “intensities” of appearance or existence within a world, he never answers the question of how we may establish in a neutral way what these intensities actually are. Along similar lines, the theory of transcendentals shows in rigorous detail the formal connection to Heyting algebras and particular (generally non-classical) logics, but nothing in this elaborate theory seems to explain how the transcendentals and logics actually come to structure the worlds to which they apply, or to what they owe their force in governing these relations of appearing and “intensities” of existence.5 It may be that Badiou wishes to refrain from posing the quid juris question of the genesis of the transcendental and the right of its application to a world, in that he fears that answering this question would inevitably lead back to one of the forms of idealism (subjectivist or linguistic) that he rejects. However, failing a good answer to the question of the force and maintenance of transcendental structures in determining appearances, it is very difficult to avoid the natural assumption that “transcendentals” are indeed structures of linguistic or conventional practice, established and held in place by the behavioral regularities of a specific cultural or language community. This assumption, of course, would lead directly back to the kind of cultural relativism that Badiou wishes above all to avoid; it is not at all clear, however, that he succeeds in forestalling it.
This leads to the second large question about the success of the project of Logics of Worlds, this time a question that also bears on the success of the earlier Being and Event. This is the question of the extent to which the elaborate formal apparatus that Badiou develops in both books in fact supports the militant political doctrines of evental change and generic Truth that underlie his more polemic claims, both with respect to existing philosophical projects and the larger socio-political situation. For it is one thing to give a formal theory, even a rigorous and sophisticated one, of how we might think of what evental or punctual change actually is (even assuming that we can follow Badiou in all of the other aspects of his often very imaginative projections of formal structures into political categories); it is quite another actually to work toward changes of this sort in real, already-structured domains, or even to know in much detail how to go about doing so. Indeed, insofar as Badiou’s theory of evental change in both books demands that the event, if it is to be truly transformative, amounts to the sudden, unpredictable advent to appearance of a kind of phenomenon that could not possibly be discerned within the previously existing situation, it seems to deprive us of the possibility of anticipating, even in vague outline, these possibilities of radical change or locating their likely sites of appearance until after the event.6 Thus, it is not clear that Badiou’s elaborate theory can actually play a significant role — despite its strong rhetoric — in supporting the kinds of change it ostensibly envisions. It is therefore to be hoped that those who receive Badiou’s work will look beyond this rhetoric to understand in detail both the highly suggestive formalisms and the innovative applications they receive here. For if reflection on formalisms and their limits does indeed represent (as it seems to) a fitting topic for at least part of what philosophy is on the way to becoming in the twenty-first century, then Badiou’s rigorous constructions and imaginative applications will be worthy of study and critical reflection for years to come.7
1 Badiou’s project of using formalism to reflect on the limits of (possible) formalism is not without precedent, however, in the analytic tradition itself. For an instructive recent example see Graham Priest, Beyond the Limits of Thought (Oxford, 2nd edition, 2003).
4 To support the necessity of affirming objective degrees of existence in a world, Badiou cites an argument against all idealist or “correlationist” philosophies that relate subject to object given by Quentin Meillasoux in After Finitude (Continuum, 2008) (pp. 118-19).
5 Indeed, the concept of “world” itself remains, despite its centrality to the whole project of Logics of Worlds, quite ill-defined. Despite all the varied examples, we are never told in clear and non-circular terms, for instance, how to understand the unity of a world as such, or how to distinguish one from another.