Long Commentary on the De Anima of Aristotle

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Averroes (Ibn Rushd) of Cordoba, Long Commentary on the De Anima of Aristotle, Richard C. Taylor (ed., tr.), Yale UP, 2009, cix + 498pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780300116687.

Loyola University, Maryland

Reviewed by Nadja Germann, Loyola University, Maryland



Averroes’ writings, more than those of any other philosopher of the Arabic-Islamic world, hold an eminent position in the medieval movement known to contemporary scholars as the translatio studiorum, a translation and appropriation movement of both ancient Greek and more recent Arabic scientific and philosophical texts in the Latin West. Oftentimes simply referred to as ‘the commentator’ due to his numerous and acute commentaries on Aristotle’s writings, Averroes can be considered the Latins’ primary teacher of Aristotelian thought, introducing them through close and insightful reading into the hitherto unknown parts of the Corpus Aristotelicum. The Long Commentary on the De Anima (henceforth LC), translated around 1220/35, belongs to this peculiar setting which already grants it its historical significance. However, the LC excels by yet another feature: it reflects Averroes’ most mature position with regard to the nature of the intellect. It is in this commentary that Averroes develops his theory of the unity of the material intellect — a theory that provoked fundamental controversies in the Latin West and is currently considered one of the key concepts defended by ‘Averroists’. The importance of the LC for later medieval intellectual history and beyond can therefore hardly be overestimated.

With his translation, Richard C. Taylor fills a twofold gap: he provides, on the one hand, the first English translation of the LC, on the other hand, the first and only complete translation into a modern Western language.1 These facts alone reveal the significance of his contribution to contemporary scholarship. With this book, Taylor makes available for a broad public — ranging from the undergraduate student to any philosophically interested person - a pivotal philosophical position that had been accessible only to a few specialists. However, it is not only for the translation that Taylor deserves respect, but also for the detailed introduction, the extensive comments on Averroes’ text, and the rich bibliography, not to mention the two indices (nominum & operum; rerum). In particular, his thorough annotations make up for the sparsity of the Latin edition which gives, as Taylor himself recalls, only identifications of the Aristotelian text passages according to Bekker’s pagination.2 These features will make Taylor’s translation an indispensable tool even for the specialist well-trained in medieval Latin, since his notes offer not only basic explanations concerning terminology and philosophico-historical background; they properly represent the current state of research and reflect the mature ampleness of Taylor’s long lasting studies in Averroes.

Beyond these remarks regarding the book in general, there are several parts and aspects that deserve particular mention. Owing to space constrictions, I will concentrate on the introduction which is, just like Taylor’s annotations, rather a contribution to the current state of research than a basic survey.3 Although it offers, as mentioned above, a rich and detailed discussion, it is strongly characterized by the focus Taylor has chosen. In view of the fact that the LC is Averroes’ most mature position regarding his theory of the nature of the intellect, Taylor has decided to concentrate on this topic. In order to reveal the peculiarities of this position, he analyzes the different stages of Averroes’ teaching which, according to his analysis, stretch from an initial position as developed in the Short Commentary on the De Anima (henceforth SC), through a middle position as defended in the Middle Commentary (henceforth MC), and a transitional period as identified with the Epistle 1 On Conjunction (henceforth E1), to the final version as represented by the LC. Taylor carefully examines controversial topics such as the dating of the MC, its relation to the LC, and the doctrine Averroes defends in each phase.

Whereas it is commonly accepted to date the SC around 1158-1160, there has been much dissent with regard to the MC, for several reasons. On the one hand, there is a close relationship between the MC and LC with the result that a considerable number of passages in both commentaries are identical. This raised already in previous research the question of which of the texts depends on the other and hence which one precedes the other or whether they were both written around the same time. On the other hand, however, there are notable differences between these two commentaries not only on the doctrinal level, but also with regard to their use of the two available Arabic De Anima translations as well as Themistius’ Paraphrase of Aristotle’s text.4 Through close analysis and evaluation of existing research Taylor comes to the conclusion that Averroes made use of “some version” of his LC, which may be called a first version, "when he composed his Middle Commentary" (p. xxxiii). This MC in turn, Averroes used later on to revise his LC whose final version, he argues, was completed after the MC.5

These chronological considerations possess significance well beyond mere historical accuracy, for provided the chronological order suggested by Taylor (SCMC-E1-LC) holds, the doctrinal differences apparent between these writings must be interpreted as a peculiar development of Averroes’ theory of the material intellect, as Taylor argues in what follows. In his SC, to begin with, Averroes clearly leans towards Alexander of Aphrodisias and, to an even higher extent, Ibn Bājja. Accordingly, he maintains that although the active intellectual principle mentioned by Aristotle in De Anima 3.5 is one separate intellectual substance, the material intellect is a disposition which each individual human possesses. Due to this disposition, humans can acquire knowledge by means of conjoining with the separate active intellect and receiving intelligibles into the imaginative soul. In this process, the forms of the imagination (previously attained through sense perception) function as subjects for the intelligibles.6

Already in MC, however, Averroes’ position has significantly shifted. As Taylor underscores, this modification was driven by Averroes’ concern regarding the requirement expressed by Aristotle that the disposition enabling man to know must be unmixed, i.e., must be purely intellectual, in order to think equally unmixed intelligibles. Consequently, he now rejects his former position according to which the forms in the imagination, which is to say particular forms of a bodily faculty, serve as subjects for the intelligibles. Instead, Averroes develops a new explanation of the material intellect that avoids this fatal dependency on corporeal forms and thus warrants the unmixed nature of human’s disposition to know. Accordingly, he maintains that this capacity — which is called ‘material intellect’ and corresponds to humans’ rationality — as such is nothing before it actually thinks. Actual thinking however, according to Averroes’ new theory, is brought about by the separate active intellect in a twofold process. First, the active intellect prepares humans’ essential capacity to know in a way that this latter can receive the intelligibles; second, it conjoins to this disposition and thus actualizes the intelligibles. Hence, Averroes still conceives of the material intellect as a disposition of the individual human being. However, its “true” or “proper” being (which consists in the activity of thinking) now depends exclusively on the separate active intellect and no longer on corporeal forms. For since the active intellect is pure intellect without any corporeal admixture, the intellectual nature of the material intellect is ensured, although it is a capacity had by an individual human being.

With this background, Taylor turns to what he calls “Averroes’ transitional position”. In this connection, he draws attention to an observation made by Marc Geoffroy with regard to the E1, which is usually considered to purport a similar view of the intellect as the MC. In this treatise, Averroes raises a question that Geoffroy understands to be the first anticipation of Averroes’ final doctrine of the material intellect.7 In the passage under discussion, Averroes asks what there is

to prevent our thinking that some dispositions might be able to exist in the way the celestial souls exist - that is, as attached to celestial bodies but not composed with them as in a subject and also as having their final and formal cause in a way separate from them?

He continues, “it seems, on the issue of this disposition, that it is a substance one in number for all human beings in itself, but many by accident, which is not the case for material forms”.8 This, however, raises the question of what may have induced Averroes to come up with this problem and ultimately to develop a new theory in his LC that defends precisely this unity of the material intellect for all human beings. Philosophically most compelling, in my view, is the consequence resulting from Averroes’ doctrine in the MC to which Taylor alludes at the end of this section (pp. xlviii-xlix): given that the material intellect despite its immateriality belongs to an individual human being, intelligibles in act, i.e., thought by a plurality of human beings, “will be multiplied and idiosyncratic to each individual human knower” (p. xlix). This, however, would mean that there is no such thing as one single body of knowledge, one single set of intelligibles, and hence one corpus of science shared by all human beings.

In relation to the E1, Averroes’ final step in the LC towards the unity of the material intellect looks like a reply to this threat. For if there is only one material intellect for all human beings which receives the intelligibles from the one active intellect, there is only one set of intelligibles to which all human beings have access and hence one unified knowledge in which all human beings share. In order to implement his new idea of the one material intellect, however, Averroes had to make a number of adjustments that Taylor carefully discusses. On the one hand, Averroes was now forced to explain how a disposition such as the material intellect which is a mere potency (to receive intelligibles) can at the same time be a “true” separate intellect, given that intellect according to Aristotle is understood to be exactly the opposite, namely activity. His solution to this problem was to consider the material intellect as a fourth kind of being. Summarized by Taylor, “it is neither matter nor form nor a composite of these, but rather a unique entity … with the nature of receptivity” (p. lxii). On the other hand, Averroes encountered the problem of how to explain that individual human beings obviously differ with regard to their knowledge. In this connection, he developed a new account of humans’ cogitative power which becomes the crucial link between the interaction of the external intellects (active and material) and the individual human souls. Its activity is the result of the individual human’s effort (to understand) and consists in the formation of denuded particular intentions. These are presented to the external intellects (active and material) whose combined activity in turn actualizes humans’ so-called theoretical intellect, i.e., the intelligible content now known by this individual. It is thus owing to the cogitative power that knowledge is “individualized” as the knowledge had by one particular person in contrast to another.

Beyond this account of Averroes’ intellectual development, Taylor discusses both the sources of the LC and its reception in the Arabic, Hebrew, and Latin cultures. In this connection, his clarifications regarding the so-called ‘Latin Averroism’ or ‘heterodox Aristotelianism’ deserve particular mention. He dedicates an entire section (pp. xcviii-civ) to a discussion of this phenomenon and its treatment in previous research. On this basis and in the light of his analysis of Averroes’ various writings on the intellect, he is in a position to do away with serious misconceptions continuing to persevere in contemporary scholarship, such as the claim that Averroes (in his LC) did not subscribe to the unity of the material intellect and that this was rather an invention by the Latin theologians.9 In view of recent developments in research, he further observes that the standard distinction between a ‘first’ and a ‘second Averroism’ need to be reconsidered, as the entire history of the reception of Averroes’ intellect theory “is still in the process of being written” (p. civ).

It is a manifest strength of Taylor’s introduction to have provided a subtle and well-documented account of the various stages of Averroes’ doctrine of the intellect. Consequently, not only Averroes scholars working on his theory of intellect, but also those interested in the fate of his thought in the Latin later Middle Ages (and even, to some extent, beyond, cf. pp. cv-cvi) will greatly benefit from this book. With these and the features mentioned at the beginning of this review, it will be both an indispensable basis for further research and, the translation in particular, a useful tool for teaching as well as an effective means for quick orientation in the text of the LC. Accordingly, I consider this book a precious contribution to current scholarship and strongly recommend it to anyone who is in one way or another interested in this field.

1 So far, there exist two French translations of Book 3: "Livre III du Grand Commentaire d’Averroès sur le Traité de l’âme d’Aristote", trans. A. Griffaton, in Majallat kullīyat al-adab wa-lʿulūm al-insānīyah, Fez, 4-5 (1980-81), pp. 741-721; 6 (1982-83), pp. 63-88; and Averroès. L’intelligence et la pensée. Grand commentaire du De anima, Livre III (429a10-435b25), trans. A. de Libera, Paris: Flammarion, 1998. There is also a complete translation into modern Arabic: Averroes. Grand commentaire sur le Traité de l’âme d’Aristote, trans. B. Gharbi, Carthage: Académie Tunisienne des Sciences, des Lettres et des Arts, “Beït al-Hikma”, 1997. Like the French translations, this Arabic translation is based on the Latin version.

It must be noted, as Taylor does in the preface, that this book “is the result of a collaborative effort, with Professor Thérèse-Anne Druart generously providing invaluable detailed critique, comment, and advice on every part of the project” (p. xi). Both for the sake of convenience and for Taylor’s acknowledgement of his “responsibility for the final form of this work” (ibid.), I will simply refer to Taylor as the responsible person throughout.

2 Taylor, by contrast, also includes

(1) identification of Averroes’ source references; (2) the extant Arabic fragments as currently available corresponding to the Latin, with English translations where the texts differ substantially; (3) the Arabic of Averroes’ citations of his alternate text of the De Anima, again with English translations where the texts differ substantially; (4) remarks on significant variations of Averroes’ Text of the De Anima from the Greek; (5) identification of the passages of the Arabic Middle Commentary which are identical to what is found in the Long Commentary; and (6) brief explanations of phraseology, technical terms, and complex argumentation (“Introduction”, p. cvii).

The Latin edition is Averrois Cordubensis Commentarium Magnum in Aristotelis De Anima Libros, ed. F. Stuart Crawford, Cambridge, MA: Medieval Academy of America, 1953. Taylor’s indications concerning his translation on pp. cvi-cix (on Crawford’s “austere edition”, p. cvii).

3 Although this introduction in general is carefully done, particularly the philologically trained reader will stumble upon a number of inconsistencies and inaccuracies concerning transcriptions from the Arabic into the Latin script, see for example p. xxiii: istiʿdādi-hi al-akhīr, but, p. xxiv: maujūd bi-l-fiʿl (my emphasis); p. xxiv: li-nā instead of la-nā; ibid.: uwar instead of -uwar; p. xxx: Ishāq instead of Isāq; cf. also the inconsistencies with regard to Arabic quotes, e.g., final “ya” which sometimes is rendered as ﻯ, sometimes as ﻱ; furthermore, the reference in n. 209 on p. cii to pp. lxxx-lxxxi seems to be flawed: what Taylor discusses in the main text would rather relate to p. lxii.

4 As Taylor emphasizes, Averroes used two different De Anima translations in his LC, namely the one usually ascribed to Isāq b. unayn and a second anonymous translation, while in his MC there are no traces of the use of an alternate translation. Regarding Themistius’ Paraphrase, both commentaries make use of it, however, not always at the identical passages, cf. “Introduction”, pp. xxix-xxx.

5 In his interpretation, Taylor primarily sides with Abdelali Elamrani-Jamal (A. Elamrani-Jamal, "Averroès: La doctrine de l’intellect matériel dans le Commentaire moyen au De anima d’Aristote. Présentation et traduction, suivie d’un lexique-index du chapitre 3, livre III: De la faculté rationnelle", in Langages et philosophie. Hommage à Jean Jolivet, ed. A. de Libera et al., Paris: Vrin, 1997, pp. 281-307) and Marc Geoffroy (M. Geoffroy and C. Steel (eds. and trans.), Averroès. La béatitude de l’âme. Editions, traductions et études, Paris: Vrin, 2001), and additionally relies on Colette Sirat and Marc Geoffroy’s studies (C. Sirat and M. Geoffroy, L’original arabe du Grand commentaire d’Averroès au De anima d’Aristote. Prémices d’édition, Paris: Vrin, 2005) in preparation of an edition of the Arabic fragments of the LC; for the entire discussion see “Introduction”, pp. xxviii-xxxiii.

6 Taylor suggests three further works of Averroes which contain this theory of intellect, the Short Commentary on the Parva Naturalia, the Epistle 2 On Conjunction, and the Epistle on the Possibility of Conjunction; according to him, this "also appears to be the doctrine expounded in his Against the Avicennians on the First Cause", “Introduction”, p. xxvii.

7 Geoffroy and Steel (2001), p. 51, see above (n. 5).

8 I quote the English translation as provided by Taylor, “Introduction”, p. xliii, who in turn relies on Geoffroy’s French translation of the Epistle in Geoffroy and Steel (2001), § 20, p. 210, as above (n. 5).

9 For this view see, for example, still J.-P. Torrell, Saint Thomas Aquinas. Volume 1: The Person and His Work, Washington, DC.: Catholic University of America Press, 2005, pp. 192-194 (originally published in French as L’Initiation à Saint Thomas d’Aquin. Sa personne et son oeuvre, Fribourg, Suisse: Editions Universitaires, and Paris: Editions du Cerf, 1993).