Losing Ourselves: Learning to Live Without a Self

Losing Ourselves

Jay L. Garfield, Losing Ourselves: Learning to Live Without a Self, Princeton University Press, 2022, 224pp., $29.95 (hbk) ISBN 978069122084.

Reviewed by Evan Thompson, University of British Columbia


The principal claims of Losing Ourselves are deceptively easy to state: We are not selves, nor do we have selves; instead, we are persons. Believing we are selves leads to moral egoism, and undermines ethics and moral cultivation; freeing ourselves from the belief in the self and realizing we are just persons facilitates ethics and moral cultivation. Jay Garfield tells us that these claims, and his arguments for them, are inspired by two philosophers: the Indian Buddhist scholiast Candrakīrti (c. 600–650 CE) and the Scottish Enlightenment thinker David Hume (1711–1776 CE).

The book’s catchy title is potentially misleading. We cannot, strictly speaking, lose our selves, since, according to Garfield, we never were or had selves in the first place. Instead, it is our supposedly “instinctive” and “atavistic” sense of self (10), which he argues is illusory, that we are advised to lose. Garfield counsels us to lose ourselves by experiencing ourselves as “fully immersed” (102), with no sense of self, and no experience of the duality of subject and object (105, 107). Losing ourselves, he tells us, will help us to have “a more salutary, mature moral engagement with those around us” (xii).

It is not clear who Garfield thinks his audience is. On the one hand, the book belongs (ironically) to the growing genre of popular self-help philosophy books. The marketing suggests it is aimed at Western Buddhists or intellectually curious readers with Buddhist sympathies: the three back-cover blurbs consist of endorsements by two well-known Western Buddhist teachers (one a Zen Buddhist and the other a Tibetan Buddhist) and one academic Buddhist scholar. On the other hand, two chapters in the middle of the book dive into the intricate details of debates about the self and consciousness in contemporary philosophy of mind. These specialized chapters may not hold the attention of readers outside academic philosophy. Knowledgeable philosophical readers, too, may be put off by them, for they misinterpret the ideas they criticize, as I will explain later. (Full disclosure: I am one of the philosophers Garfield criticizes in these chapters and elsewhere in the book.)

Garfield’s way of distinguishing between “self” and “person” lies at the heart of his argument. Persons are “complex, constructed, socially embedded psychophysical complexes” (6). They exist, but only “conventionally,” dependent on and constituted by our habits and customs of thinking and talking, and our social practices. Selves do not exist at all, but what a self is supposed to be turns out to be a moving target. Early in the book we are told that the self is the ātman of the Upaniṣads—a unitary subject of experience and agent of action that endures throughout a person’s life. (Actually, most Brahminical philosophical traditions deny that the ātman is an agent.) It is neither one’s mind nor one’s body, but rather is the bearer of one’s mind and one’s body. The Christian soul (psyche) is also said to be a self. In an endnote, Garfield writes, “I am deciding to use self exclusively to refer to the ātman, psyche, soul, or that core of our being that I have argued to be illusory” (177). Later in the book, however, Garfield’s target is contemporary conceptions of the self in phenomenological philosophy of mind. They do not involve the idea that the self is the bearer of one’s mind and body, or that it is one’s enduring essence (“core of our being”), so the target has shifted.

Garfield realizes that many readers would say they do not believe in selves as he has defined them. His response is that we all have an “innate tendency” to succumb to the “cognitive illusion” of there being such a self (6). He thinks that “philosophical arguments for the reality of the self are only ways to ramify that illusion into explicit doctrine” (6). But the philosophers he contends with later in the book reject the idea that the self is one’s enduring essence and the bearer of one’s mind and body. So Garfield needs to do two things: he needs to show that we all are in the grip of the illusion of self, despite what we may say, and he needs to show that the philosophical arguments he rejects are elaborations of the illusion or are otherwise mistaken. Garfield does not succeed at either task.

Garfield’s argument that we all, deep down, believe that we are or have selves takes the form of a thought experiment. Imagine having someone else’s body. You are not to imagine being them, but rather being you, with their body as yours. Next, imagine having someone else’s mind (again, this means being you with their mind as yours). At this point some of you may balk. Maybe it’s not actually possible to imagine this. Maybe, for example, you cannot help but inevitably smuggle something of your own mind or body into the scenario, so that you cannot imagine it as it’s strictly intended. Let’s set aside these kinds of questions, which Garfield does not consider, and grant that the scenario is imaginable. What follows from this feat of imagination? Garfield thinks it shows “that you, like nearly everyone, are convinced, deep down, that there is a self” (9). He continues: “the very fact that you were able to follow me in this thought experiment shows that, at least before you think hard about it, you take yourself to be distinct from both your mind and your body, to be the thing that has your mind and your body, but that, without losing its identity, could take on another mind, another body, just like changing your clothes” (9).

This argument is invalid. That you can imagine something when given a precise script does not entail that what you imagine reveals beliefs you had all along, let alone beliefs that are “instinctive” and “atavistic.” Garfield says it is “our instinctive sense of self that enables us to imagine having another body or another mind” (10). In other words, he draws a strong conclusion about our basic psychological makeup just from our ability to perform a certain abstruse feat of imagination. The reasoning is erroneous. Not only is imagination one thing and belief another, but also nothing has been said to rule out the possibility that the apparent belief is a product of the thought experiment, not something in place prior to it. Consider this alternative account: We instinctively and habitually experience ourselves as intentional agents dynamically geared into the world, not as separate selves who happen to appropriate a particular body and mind as their own from a witnessing perspective, but we can be made to identify with the feeling of being such a witness when our imagination is suitably coaxed. Garfield says nothing to rule out this interpretation. To establish his position we would need to have an independently tested and confirmed psychological theory of our habitual sense of self, one that would have the imaginability and intuitive plausibility of his thought experiment as one of its predictions. Garfield never mentions the need for such a theory, so his whole way of approaching the issue about our sense of self through just a thought experiment is methodologically faulty.

Here’s what I suspect has gone wrong. Garfield believes in the truth of the Buddhist normative viewpoint that our “primal confusion, the root of suffering,” is “taking ourselves to be selves” (35, his emphasis). According to this viewpoint, we ought not to identify with, or affectively cling to, any changing state of the body or the mind as if that state were an enduring self, because such identification and affective clinging are the fundamental root of human suffering. If one already believes this, then the thought experiment can be used, from a Buddhist perspective, to illustrate how that confused misidentification can manifest in philosophical imagination. Garfield’s mistake is making the thought experiment into an independent argument for the truth of the Buddhist viewpoint as a matter of descriptive empirical psychology.[1] This results in the invalid reasoning and defective method just mentioned. Garfield is not alone in falling prey to these kinds of mistakes; as I have argued elsewhere, they happen frequently in modern Buddhist thought (see Thompson 2020).

Garfield uses familiar arguments from Indian Buddhist philosophy to convince us that we are persons, not selves. If there were a self, Candrakīrti argues, it would have to be either identical to or different from the psychophysical processes that make up our lives, but it is neither identical to one of them, several of them, or all of them arranged in a suitable way (they are all constantly in flux), nor is it something different from them (see Padmakara Translation Group 2002, 281–305). So there is no self, not even conventionally (because the kind of self under consideration cannot be merely conventional). But there are persons. The classic Buddhist analogy is the chariot, first given by the nun Vajirā in an early scripture named after her (Vajirā Sutta). In another text, The Questions of King Milinda (Milindapañha), from around the beginning of the Common Era, the Buddhist monk Nagasena points out to King Milinda that his chariot is not the same as any of its parts, is not identical to all the parts properly arranged (because then it would cease to exist if any of its parts were changed), and is not something different from its parts. Similarly, persons are not the same as their psychophysical parts, nor are they different from them. Chariots and persons exist, but only because we take an interest in certain parts being arranged in certain ways. Their mode of existence is conventional and nominal: it depends on how we conceptualize and designate a plurality of elements as one thing over time and at a time.

Garfield’s treatment of these ideas is accessible and will be engaging for readers not familiar with classical Indian Buddhist philosophy. But philosophical readers will be unsatisfied. Why should we think that a non-sentient artifact is a good analogy for understanding the nature of persons? Why aren’t persons more like organisms than like chariots? Organisms, unlike chariots, have a unity that does not depend on our linguistic conventions of individuation, because organisms are organized to produce and maintain themselves as individuals through constant material transformation (see Thompson 2007, Moreno and Mossio 2015). Although some aspects of our personhood are conventional, not all are, if being animals is constitutive of our being persons. Garfield might reply, in keeping with traditional Buddhist philosophy, that animals, too, are conventional, because all composite things are conventional. But this move would make his position turn on larger, debatable metaphysical ideas, and would no longer specifically concern persons.

I turn now to Garfield’s engagement with contemporary philosophers.

In two chapters called “The Self Strikes Back” (I and II), Garfield tries to refute philosophers who maintain that selves, understood differently from his definition, are real. His title is a misnomer. The views he discusses arise from efforts to understand the phenomenology of consciousness and subjectivity, not from trying to strike back against the kind of no-self theory he advocates.

Garfield’s first target is the idea that the self exists as an experiential structure of consciousness. Certain philosophers, particularly (but not exclusively) in the phenomenological tradition, argue that there is a minimal form of self-awareness that consists in a basic structure of consciousness, which is variously termed “reflexive awareness,” “pre-reflective self-awareness,” or “intransitive self-awareness.” Garfield confusingly treats these concepts as if they mean different things, but they do not: they are all ways of describing or referring to how intentional consciousness is held to involve a kind of self-consciousness. He also mistakenly describes arguments for minimal self-awareness as intended to show that there is “a unified, continuing subject of experience, an agent of action, distinct from mind and body” (82). None of the philosophers he discusses—Galen Strawson, Dan Zahavi, and me—makes this claim.

Garfield misdescribes Strawson’s (2011) thesis that “all awareness comports awareness of itself” in two ways. (He also does not quote the proper formulation of the thesis.) First, the thesis is not that “every act of awareness is bipolar in its structure, having two distinct objects of awareness” (69). Reflexive awareness, according to Strawson, is not directed to itself as a second, distinct object (see also Strawson 2013). Second, the thesis is not that “when I am aware of an apple on my desk, I am ipso facto aware of the fact that I am aware of that apple” (69, second emphasis mine, see also 90). Rather, reflexive awareness is held to be non-propositional: when I see the apple I also experience my seeing, but I do not represent the fact that I am seeing the apple unless I explicitly reflect on the experience. The apple is the object; my seeing is “non-thetically” self-aware, which means it is not the focus of attention. (Strawson goes on to discuss “thetic present-moment self-awareness,” but Garfield does not distinguish between thetic and non-thetic awareness.)

Garfield claims that Strawson, in arguing for the reflexivity thesis, mistakenly infers from the mere fact of awareness to the existence of a distinct and singular subject of awareness, and mistakenly assumes that awareness has an experiential subject-object structure. Both his claims are the opposite of the truth. Strawson has always been careful to say, including in the article Garfield discusses, that the existence of the subject is nothing over and above the existence of the experiences themselves (see also Strawson 1994, 132; 2013). Nor does Strawson think that experience must have a subject-object structure. Take Zhuangzi’s story of Butcher Ding, which Garfield reads as a case of “immersion” lacking subject-object duality (102–111). Strawson would say that there is something it is like for the immersion to occur—after all, Butcher Ding describes how it feels in precise detail—so it occurs for a subject who is no different from the immersion experience. In other words, Strawson would maintain that the subject, in his sense, remains present despite the absence of there seeming to be a distinct, singular, enduring subject standing over against a separate object. Garfield has gotten the basics of Strawson’s view wrong, so his criticisms miss the mark.

Garfield also misconstrues Zahavi’s concept of the “for-me-ness” of experience. Zahavi does not say that “the property of for-me-ness is what distinguishes my own experiences from those of others” (85). He says that it is what distinguishes how my experiences are given to me versus how your experiences are given to me (and how your experiences are given to you versus how mine are given to you). Zahavi’s claim is that experiences are not given to the experiencer anonymously (as Georg Lichtenberg claimed), but first-personally (“for-me”), and that this contrasts with how the same experiences can also be given second-personally (Zahavi 2005, 125; 2014, 24). Contrary to Garfield, Zahavi does not say that for-me-ness is a property of the object or content of experience, but rather that it is an adverbial modification of the experiential act (when I have experiences I have them “minely”) (Zahavi 2014, 22). Garfield says that the concept of for-me-ness is a way of indicating location in an inner space of experience, and that such an inner space is a myth or illusion “because there is nothing to which we can point of which our subjectivity is the interior” (87). This is a crude misunderstanding. “For-me-ness” does not refer to a location in an inner space; it refers to an aspect of how experiences feel in living through them firsthand. Finally, Garfield does not take into account Zahavi’s writings where he deals with the kinds of objections Garfield makes, so Garfield’s case suffers from not being up to date (see Zahavi 2014, 22–24).

Garfield criticizes one of my arguments for reflexive awareness based on Dignāga’s memory argument (Thompson 2011): When you remember yesterday’s blue sky, you remember not just the sky but also seeing the sky, to remember something you must have experienced it, so you must have experienced your seeing at the time. Garfield makes a series of mistakes in his treatment of this argument. (i) Memory, he says, is a “reconstruction of the past” (his emphasis), “a cognitive fabrication,” not “a straightforward retrieval” of a past experience (80–81). This is true but irrelevant. Veridical (accurate) episodic memory involves reconstruction, but the construction process works with sedimented phenomenal elements of past experience, including pre-reflective self-awareness. The reconstruction is based on re-enacting aspects of the brain patterns and body states that were originally generated in consciously perceiving an event, including those subserving affect and self-experience, and thus it brings back to life, as it were, not just what was experienced (the object aspect, the blue sky) but also how it was experienced (the subject aspect, the felt awareness of seeing). (ii) Memory, Garfield says, does not differ in kind from imagination, but only in its causal ancestries. This is false. Episodic memory involves a feeling of pastness and posits its content as past; imagination does not need to do this. Their intentionalities are different in kind. Garfield says nothing in response to these points made in my article (see also Thompson 2007, 289–297). (iii) Garfield says that even if you thematize your subjectivity in memory, that does not mean that your subjectivity was thematized in the original experience (81). This is true but irrelevant. The claim is that the original experience is pre-reflectively (non-thematically) self-aware, not that subjectivity is explicit or thematized in it. You thematize subjectivity in memory by making the memory a reflective one, even if the original experience was not a reflective one. (iv) Finally, Garfield takes me to be using the memory argument to show that “some single thing persists,” “some underlying substance” (82, his emphasis), as the basis of memory, but I explicitly reject this idea; rather, I assert that the psychophysical stream itself is self-retentional and thereby minimally self-aware (Thompson 2011, 173; see also Thompson 2007, 317–328).

Garfield thinks that the idea of pre-reflective self-awareness requires that each act of awareness presupposes another act of awareness that makes it aware, and thereby entails a vicious regress (94). This is false and arises from a fundamental misunderstanding of the nature of pre-reflective self-awareness (and of the sustained and careful discussion of it in the phenomenological literature). Pre-reflective self-awareness is not an act directed upon itself as a separate and distinct object. This is easiest to see in the case of time-consciousness. When you listen to a melody you are retentionally aware of the just-past notes by retaining your experience of hearing them. The notes are the intentional object, but they are experientially present in their flowing away thanks to how the stream of consciousness retains its past phases. Awareness relates to itself in retention, but not by being directed onto itself as an object (Zahavi 2005, chapter 3; Thompson 2007, 327–328).

Garfield has other criticisms that misrepresent my viewpoint. (i) I do not defend “an even more minimal view of the self” in my later work than in my earlier work. Since Mind in Life (Thompson 2007) my view has been that the experiential self is a multifaceted construction, involving prereflective self-awareness, time-consciousness, narrative selfhood, mental time travel, and intersubjectivity (see Thompson 2014, chapter 10; Thompson 2020, chapter 3). (ii) Garfield insists that my view just amounts to redefining “self” as “person.” Garfield is free to use “self” however he likes, but his usage does not fit the concept as it figures in large swathes of philosophy (Taylor 1989), including phenomenology and parts of cognitive science, which are the perspectives from which I am writing. He thinks “self” must be restrictively defined as a single thing that is a separate bearer of the mind and body, because “this is the way we instinctively take ourselves to exist” (91). But his argument for this claim is invalid, as we have seen. So to keep insisting on his usage when discussing other authors who conceptualize the self differently is blinkered and tendentious, and is to argue against a strawman.

Garfield ends his critical discussion of other philosophers by considering the idea that the self is a narrative construction. His discussion is short (3.5 pages), amounts just to the assertion that these theorists are really talking about the person, not the self, and does not take account of the various reasons why narrative theorists—Alasdair MacIntyre, Charles Taylor, Paul Ricoeur, Marya Schechtman, and Daniel Hutto—use the term “self” and not just “person.” For example, in the case of MacIntyre, Taylor, and Ricoeur, “self” is typically used not to stand for an entity, but for “selfhood,” understood as individual subjectivity in its reflexivity, such that it inquires into itself, whereas “person” designates a concrete, named individual in a time, place, and culture.

In Garfield’s chapter on “Immersion,” Zhuangzi’s Butcher Ding is said to exemplify skillful spontaneity with no subject-object duality and no sense of self. I agree that the story can be read as illustrating what today is often called “flow,” in which ordinary subject-object duality is said to be absent from expert performance. But it is far from obvious that every sense of self is absent, particularly the minimal and narrative senses of self of concern to phenomenologists, given that Butcher Ding narrates the changes in his perception and self-experience resulting from his having “advanced beyond skill” (Lynn 2022, 69). Indeed, we can describe Butcher Ding as having an enriched, powerful, and effortless sense of self. Consider his statement, “Raising my knife and standing there, as a result I look all around and linger awhile filled with satisfaction because of what I have done,” and Guo Xiang’s (265–312 CE) commentary on it: “This indicates one self-fulfilled with all his sense of preeminence and pleasure” (Lynn 2022, 70). This hardly seems like “the elimination of one’s sense of self” (105, Garfield’s emphasis).

Garfield leans heavily on the concept of automaticity when describing skillful action such as Butcher Ding’s. But, from a cognitive science perspective, automaticity generally means independent of attention and awareness (though the concept can be operationalized in different ways). Expert performance, however, is highly attention-dependent, even if it is not effortful in the way that novice attention is. Butcher Ding’s actions are acutely attentive; and they do not occur outside awareness, given that he can remember them and describe them retrospectively in great detail.

In his last chapters, Garfield turns to ethics and how our personhood is inherently social. His lucidly stated position, based on developmental psychologist Vasudevi Reddy’s work, that “first-person and second-person are co-emergent,” and that “We cannot understand our own self-consciousness without understanding its emergence through our consciousness of others” (142) (and, it should be added, their consciousness of us), is one that phenomenologists and developmental psychologists going back to Vygotsky have long insisted on.

Garfield’s treatment of ethics, however, appears to be based on a huge non sequitur. This is that belief in the self (as he defines it) entails moral egoism, and thereby undermines ethical life and ethical engagement with others (121,171). This strikes me as preposterous. Numerous philosophers who resolutely believe in the kind of essential self that Garfield rejects—Plato, Augustine, Aquinas, Kant, Ramanuja, Simone Weil, Iris Murdoch, to name just a few—castigate moral egoism. Garfield gives no reasons to believe such philosophers are being inconsistent. Believing deeply in a metaphysical self does not make one selfish in the moral sense. On the contrary, some of the strongest arguments against moral egoism come precisely from philosophers who uphold the equality, intrinsic value, and fundamental dignity of all selves.

Garfield’s writing is zestful. But his invalid arguments and careless readings of other philosophers vitiate his case. If we are to lose ourselves, it will need to be for better reasons than we are given here.


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Lynn, Richard John, Zhuangzi. A New Translation of the Sayings of Master Zhuang as Interpreted by Guo Xiang. New York: Columbia University Press, 2022.

Moreno, Alvaro and Mossio, Matteo. Biological Autonomy: A Philosophical and Theoretical Enquiry. Dordrecht: Springer, 2014.

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Strawson, Galen. “Radical Self-Awareness.” In Mark Siderits, Evan Thompson, and Dan Zahavi, eds., Self, No Self? Perspectives from Analytical, Phenomenological and Indian Traditions. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 274–307.

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Thompson, Evan. Mind in Life: Biology, Phenomenology, and the Sciences of Mind. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2007.

Thompson, Evan. “Self-No-Self? Memory and Reflexive Awareness.” In Mark Siderits, Evan Thompson, and Dan Zahavi, eds., Self, No Self? Perspectives from Analytical, Phenomenological and Indian Traditions. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 157–175.

Thompson, Evan. Waking, Dreaming, Being: Self and Consciousness in Neuroscience, Meditation, and Philosophy. New York: Columbia University Press, 2014.

Thompson, Evan. Why I Am Not a Buddhist. New Haven and London: Yale University Press, 2020.

Zahavi, Dan. Subjectivity and Selfhood: Investigating the First-Person Perspective. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press, 2005.

Zahavi, Dan. Self and Other: Exploring Subjectivity, Empathy, and Shame. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014.

[1] I have used the same thought experiment, inspired by Garfield 2015, 106, but not as an argument for our having an instinctive belief in the self, but rather as a way to illustrate how Buddhist philosophers understand the personal essence they argue is an illusion. See Thompson 2020, 89–90