Lost Intimacy in American Thought: Recovering Personal Philosophy from Thoreau to Cavell

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Edward F. Mooney, Lost Intimacy in American Thought: Recovering Personal Philosophy from Thoreau to Cavell, Continuum, 2009, 234pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441168580.

Reviewed by Tim Gould, Metropolitan State College of Denver



Edward Mooney’s eloquent and challenging Lost Intimacy in American Thought is perhaps even more encompassing than its subtitle suggests. While Thoreau and Cavell do indeed anchor the structure of this book and the places it explores, there are a host of figures that occupy significant positions in this struggle to regain something lost in our thought. Most especially, he examines closely the work of Henry Bugbee, an elusive figure among American philosophers, belonging both to a certain moment at Harvard and to a longer period of his life in the American West. (Bugbee’s writing seems to traverse the various boundaries between nature and culture, including the more antagonistic aspects of each.) It is hard to imagine a more generous and more detailed accounting of Bugbee’s interests and themes, along with an appreciation of his passionate and lucid prose. The pages on Bugbee are the most numerous and often the most rewarding in the book. For this account alone, the book would deserve a thoughtful reading.

Other figures play their parts in this passionate, yet intellectual drama. The drama is at once moving, even revitalizing, but also upsetting. Perhaps it could not fulfill its goals if it failed to upset its readers. To paraphrase Emerson in what could be a motto for this book, only those who can still be unsettled are able to find hope.

Mooney’s book is quietly loaded with juxtapositions of beauty and violence (including violent death) that can jar the reader and not just his or her sensibility. He writes of the impact of Arendt on Eichmann and other figures that make their appearance and briefly haunt us with the sheer fact of the Holocaust. J. Glenn Grey’s book The Warriors is a book that makes no moral judgments, except to indicate the lyricism and the horrors that a soldier faces and must act upon. Thoreau on John Brown reminds us of the campaign of murder in Bloody Kansas, and there is also the enigmatic corpse of Margaret Fuller, dying with all her fantastic promise. There is Bruce Wilshire’s frozen north, a companion to the uninhabitable summit of Thoreau’s Mt. Ktaadin, and there is, somewhat incongruously, Salmon Rushdie and the continuing shadow of the famous fatwa, and the stubborn persistence of the songs and singers of the world.

There are also chapters or significant pieces of chapters on the work of Henry James (and Robert Pippin’s treatment of James), fragments of Ortega and the less orthodox theological tradition that includes Meister Eckhart and whatever tradition (if any) is represented by The Brothers Karamazov. The sheer conjunction of these figures is illuminating but also challenging. It is illuminating because it would be easy to ignore the number of figures in American thought who do not fit neatly into Continental or Analytic boxes and who can be seen to share certain preoccupations with our loss of closeness to the world.

But is also a challenge to summarize the “plot” of Mooney’s book and hence the way he brings together these apparently disparate figures. However one finally traces the pattern in his tapestry, it is important from the outset to note that there is such a pattern (or perhaps more than one), and that Mooney has not heaped up a small mountain of his favorite writers, all of them connected by the themes of love and intimacy.

A short version of the plot goes something like this: sometime in the last century, or perhaps during the Enlightenment, we fell out of love with the world. To show us what this love and intimacy mean and hence what it means to lose them is one of the main goals of this book. As we stand our words have lost almost all real connection with the world (mostly with people but also with the specific beings: trees, rivers, animals, the earth itself and its “places” that lie under the world). At the same time, we have lost touch with ourselves. He wants to recapture the writers who bring us back to this intimacy of the word with the world. One form this intimacy will take is crucially referred is “falling in love with the world”. This love and this intimacy will make the world more vivid and might even make us and the world more alive, in some reciprocal form of rebirth. (Lost Intimacy, 116-119) The task of philosophy (and art), which either supplements the tasks of religion or replaces them (as religion presently stands), is to entice us back to the world, willing for its response and willing for the love it inspires.

A book so generous and so dedicated to inclusiveness is likely to invite some moments where the reader says, in an old American idiom: “Include me out”. Or perhaps some types of disagreement will show the stakes of sympathy and of agreement.

For all the power of his remarks on voice, on passion, and on affirmation in Mooney’s account of Cavell as “a religious, continental thinker” (111), Mooney constrains his reading to some extent by striving to use Cavell’s only line (so far as I know) about falling in love with the world. Perhaps he is following Cavell’s later comments on the intuition of the “death of the world”, which is indeed sympathetic to Mooney’s sense of things. Mooney cites in relation to loving the world, among other texts, Cavell’s especially difficult comments on Wittgenstein’s remark: “If you are certain, aren’t you shutting your eyes in the face of doubt? To which the interlocutor replies: ‘they are shut.’” (Philosophical Investigations, 3rd ed., 224) More literally he (or she?) says, “They are shut to me”, which is not quite to say that something other than me shut them for me.

Mooney takes note of the fact that the “argument from design” makes an appearance in Cavell’s discussion. Mooney suggests, I think rightly, that this argument is some sort of detour from a more direct approach to God and hence to the world. Then we might take this to mean that falling in love with the world is a way of avoiding this detour into argument. I am not sure this is how Mooney takes it, but since this way is plausible, it is worth noting that there is another way of taking Cavell’s passage: responding to the sense that we all must sometimes shut our eyes in the face of doubt, Cavell writes

It is something different to live without doubt, without so to speak the threat of skepticism. To live in the face of doubt, eyes happily shut, would be to fall in love with the world. For if there is a correct blindness, only love has it. (Claim of Reason, 431)

I do not mean to quibble, but what is about to emerge from Cavell’s consideration of skepticism is important to his entire project: if we cannot remain open to skepticism concerning the other, either we have no best case for skepticism here, or we haven’t allowed the best case to emerge. (432) The paradox is that what Cavell avoids is not skepticism but the avoidance of skepticism. Someone might live with their eyes shut, or be blind to any possibility including the default of the world itself. For the rest of us, falling in love with the world would be foreclosing the issue of skepticism, not grasping its force or its extent and not being illuminated by its necessary possibility.

But since love remains a believable, perhaps visible possibility for being in the world, I take Mooney’s path from these words, not so much as a competing interpretation of Cavell as a profoundly respectful and indefatigable alternative to Cavell’s account of skepticism. Along with the more obvious horrors of the 20th century, Mooney seems to reserve a desire to quarantine what became of (academic) philosophy in the years after WWII. These years shaped the discipline as he (and, somewhat earlier, Cavell) would encounter it. He also summarizes the intellectual deficit in a certain way of inheriting Continental philosophy. He says that

explanatory and deflationary schematic analysis, powerful in its own right, works at a price. It brackets my experienced affections and anxieties, and suspends experiential absorption. I assume these points can strike home without a detailed and no doubt contentious assessment of the variety of critical-theoretical in play in departments of English, art history, comparative literature, or religious studies, for example. (167, n7).

This is a fascinating moment if only for its sharp sense that something theoretical is constraining our openness to experience. On the previous page, Mooney writes

The familiar techniques of criticism and theory are fine in their place. We become expert in teaching them and applying them. I could run through their virtues, but my interest is not in their relative strength and differences, what each can accomplish, but in what gets forgotten as we strive to refine our use of Derrida or Freud, Durkheim or Feuerbach, Eagleton or Adorno. An open response to wonder or dread, to moral horror or the primal mystery of birth emerges at a pre-theoretical or pre-disciplinary level. Yet to abandon this is to lose intimacy with the world and ourselves. (166)

This passage is clearly heartfelt. Yet it seems oddly positioned if it is directed at particular writers such as Derrida, Nietzsche, or Lacan, as the next footnote suggests. (166, n4) It seems rather a new version of the old sense that writing is only writing, philosophy is only philosophy, and neither can bring us into direct contact with a world of things, let alone people and their lived experiences. But why should that be the goal, in that formulation, of writing or philosophy, even the most transformative “theoretical” writing? This failure does not seem to reflect badly on, say, any particular way of teaching, or on any other theoretical matrix. Some experiences lie too deep for words, anyway for words so far as I have fathomed them. That words do not do everything does not mean that they do nothing, in particular that they do nothing to bring people closer to some primal experiences. The Phaedo is a pretty theoretical dialogue. But when Socrates responds to the query “What shall we do with you when you are dead?” with the gentle joke: “Anything you like, provided you can catch me”, I find that I am moved. Mooney, I think, would share this sense and maintain that such writing is a good start. I would invite him to say what more he wants from philosophical (or theoretical) discourse.

Noting what I experience as analytic gaps in Mooney texts, I feel I am noting not failures but aspects of the book’s identity (and perhaps of mine, as a certain kind of reader of this book). For none of these lacunae finally matter to the over-arching sweep of his meditations. But they might matter to those who would follow Mooney in tracing the intricate question between the love of the world and the emergence of skepticism. For one of Mooney’s major formulations of what his project opposes takes skepticism as the denial of the love of the world, as it takes perfectionism (partly in Cavell’s terms) as a step towards such a love. Something critical emerges from a more detailed confrontation between the issues of experience and the issues of skepticism. Cavell’s thought is that our conceptions of experience and skepticism are just made to quarrel with each other. And this is also a thought that is made to be overlooked — and not only by those who are not in philosophy. It is very much to Mooney’s credit that he picks up on both sides of this conflict. He accurately notes that Cavell discovers that even “skepticism Cartesian style” (116) has within it the allegory of the refusal of others. And he takes the diagnosis of ideology in Marx, Nietzsche and Freud to be readable as forms of skepticism, at least in some larger sense of the word. He emphasizes the suspiciousness of such writers towards the self-satisfaction of our ordinary experience. In such an emphasis — which is nearly universal in the world of “theory” — we are in danger of missing precisely the new forms of certainty that emerge with each new diagnosis (whether of the fetishism of clothing or the fetishism of commodities). It is true that there is a kind of a Copernican shift in the way we now accept the truth: We move from the passive certainties of common sense to the active overturning of what masquerades as truth. But this sort of unmasking contains its own allegories of arriving at the truth, allegories which remain to be further investigated. Some kind of idealism can be seen, somewhat disguised, as a form of the skeptic or at least as the problematizer of objectivity, already in Marx’s Theses on Feuerbach. And something similar is refuted by the discovery of the dynamic unconscious in Freud. But we have yet to figure out the ways in which subjectivity will — always already? — make its appearance. The left also has its “enemies list” and it is a list of people (subjects) not of “subject positions”. It is as if the need for some self to blame is one thing we can’t get rid of; it forms the basis of our most fundamental theology of the self.

Mooney picks up a line of thought of Ortega y Gasset, and it turns out to be one of the ways he binds the threads of reflections: Ortega’s characterization of his Meditations on Quixote as “essays in intellectual love.” (3) His Meditations on Quixote will “take up a ‘man, a book, a picture, a landscape, an error, a sorrow’ and then seek to ‘carry it by the shortest route to its fullest significance.’” In the next paragraph, Mooney says of such essays that they can “carry out a generous, even pious criticism.” (3) Or an elaboration that brings a theme or person or person to its next step of fuller meaning .This interpretation of “intellectual love” as a form of generosity is one of Mooney’s most characteristic and pervasive spiritual movements, one which he does not merely discuss but also enacts.

One imagines that such moments are talismans that protect Mooney from the loss of experience, or from what Cavell and Robert Warshow relate to the loss of our use of our experience. Here is a distinction worth pursuing. Mooney joins both writers in the vividness of certain writing, and the constant unwillingness to give up the ambition to rejoin one’s self and the world through the medium of experience.

One last example of this human willingness to forego the world can come as a surprise. Mooney adduces Bruce Wilshire’s account of addiction as more than merely a symptom of an individual pathology.

As sensate, sensual creatures we are connected to “inner selves”, others and the place we inhabit through a felt sense of body, place and meaning. Lacking that connection … we descend to addictive processes. A quick fix from whatever void we feel, when work becomes lifeless, eating becomes a bother or an outright enemy, when conversation becomes chatter, exercise is a chore and our own and other’s suffering becomes an unwanted imposition. Lacking the essential spiritual connections [Wilshire’s coinage], life is stagnant, dull, a matter ultimately of boredom and frightful desperation. The Earth is unsteady beneath our feet (137).

It is hard to say how what Wilshire writes as "the *spiritual" is to be distinguished from the realm of the therapeutic. And we still have to endure what Freud called the common miseries of everyday life. (Mooney is well aware of this.) What remains important is the vision in Wilshire and in Mooney: Wilshire conceives of addictions as abortive false starts, mimicking a legitimate quest for ecstatic experience. It’s as if the world of the addict gets flattened, drained of the several alternative rich sources of ecstasy, say in music, fulfilling work, friendship, or wilderness experience. In such a flattened world, all that remains is a cheap, momentary and destructive fix.

Somewhere in the paragraph I cited his paraphrase of Wilshire’s point merges into the vision of Mooney’s book. When we can no longer fall in love with the world, take that plunge, we flatten the world in a kind of revenge. This revenge changes the world as it changes what we might call the shape of our soul, now bent to fit the shape not of the world’s sublimities but of its enticements.

Something like this vision has been at work in Romantic poetry and prose since Wordsworth’s “Essay, Supplementary” (1815). I do not think that Mooney would reject the title of Romantic thinker. His wish to revive the world, to bring it back to life, is Romanticism at its best. This is part of what makes it seem so unpalatable to modernity and also to analytic philosophy, for which this aspiration is a type of fallacy. Mooney does not need to claim that everything he is interested in is Romantic, still less that Romanticism contains everything of interest. But we can surely note that a certain set of themes and tasks began at the end of the 18th century and continues today in the interstices of modern thought. This is both a substantial claim and one that brings its own evidence to light the more you are absorbed by it. Such absorption may not be all there is to redeeming the world, or writing about it redemptively. But no one even partially drawn to such projects will want to ignore the power and the detail of this book.