Love: A New Understanding of an Ancient Emotion

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Simon May, Love: A New Understanding of an Ancient Emotion, Oxford University Press, 2019, 285pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190884833.

Reviewed by Eric J. Silverman, Christopher Newport University


Simon May's new book on love is truly ambitious. He hopes to offer a genuinely new answer to a question that's been around at least since Phaedrus asked his friends to offer speeches defining and praising love in Plato's Symposium.

In Part I, May examines the question 'What is love?', identifying the current understanding of love's aim, motivation, and ground. He takes love to be an unconditional, disinterested, enduring affirmation of the beloved. In contemporary culture, he sees this kind of love as a 'secularized agape,' which is now sought within human relationships in an effort to replace the role that faith in God and divine love have filled in the past. Thus, the phenomenon he seeks to explain is no more than a century and a half old. Yet, he thinks this goal for love leads to an inevitable challenge since no human can fulfill the emotional role that has traditionally required a perfect divine being.

Accordingly, a new understanding of love is needed. May argues that love's foundational desire is actually grounded in the promise of 'ontological rootedness,' attaching us to a promise and feeling of home. Thus, according to him, love is a joyful response to the promise of ontological rootedness. Following Nietzsche, he portrays contemporary human love as a psychological replacement seeking to fill the void that the imaginary theistic God once occupied.

May argues that the traditional expectation that love be unconditional and completely independent of the beloved's attributes causes a serious problem. It results in an account of love that fails to explain why we love some people rather than others, since we cannot appeal to the distinctive personal traits which distinguish one human from another. He proceeds to examine and reject six views of love that he identifies in the Western tradition since the time of the ancient Greeks before turning to offer his own account. These rejections of mainstream answers within the Western tradition entail rejecting any notion that we should have an unconditional love for all or for one's neighbor. Much of this portion of the book was at least implicit in May's previous monograph Love, a History.

In Part II, May makes a positive case for his account of love. He shows that many traditional Western views of love include important motifs that are purportedly better explained by his own account. Accordingly, to experience love as ontological rootedness in another person is to experience the beloved in four distinct ways. First, to love someone is to find in the beloved a source of personal identity. Thus, to care for the beloved is to affirm ourselves and our identity in connection with that person. Second, to love is to identify in the beloved a core of shared values and virtues that constitute our shared ethical home. Third, to love is to intensify our sense of reality and vitality, thus to reaffirm the power of our shared existence. Finally, to love is to experience the beloved as a kind of calling to a shared future destiny. Thus, love gives a source of personal identity, an ethical home, an affirmation of existence, and a vision of shared future together. These four features were once included in the person's religious commitment to God, and more recently have been sought in romantic or marital love. May, however, finds both these objects of love unsatisfactory.

In Part III, May uses two foundational stories of Western culture to illustrate his view of love: Abraham's search to the Promised Land and Odysseus's return to Ithaca in The Odyssey. Both stories center on our desire for a beloved home. A home that defines us, that shapes our ethical values, that intensifies our sense of reality, and that calls us to a future together with our beloved community. Consider the Abrahamic story: Abraham's monotheistic God is universally available to be loved, to offer love, and to emulate in love. He calls Abraham to a distinct identity, to a distinct set of values, to see Himself as the source of both personal and universal existence, and to have faith in a future together in the communion of believers. The story depicts all four aspects of May's love as ontological rootedness, as does The Odyssey. This is the experience we seek in love, whether the object is God, our country, a lover, or our children.

Part IV turns to the issues concerning love in its traditional connection to interpersonal romance, sex, goodness, and beauty. May criticizes the view stemming from Plato that love is based in beauty and a desire to obtain ongoing union with beauty. Obviously, while we often connect beauty to our accounts of love, we do not systematically love things and people in proportion to their beauty. Instead, beauty is an invitation to look into another for the four ontological conditions of love, which we might or might not find in them. Of course, where love has been discovered, it is natural to perceive increased beauty once we take joy in another as our ontological home, since such a home is undoubtedly beautiful to us.

May proceeds to argue that sex is no basis for love, but like beauty, sex includes intense attentiveness to another, inviting us try to glimpse whether this person can offer us ontological rootedness. Furthermore, sex can be a perfectly appropriate expression of love, intimacy, and ontological connectedness as it can demonstrate the existence of a 'we'. Such a 'we' can embody our loving ontological home. Of course, while sex can have this deep connection to love, sex is hardly a sufficient condition for love as it does not guarantee that our lover can or will be a suitable ontological home for us.

In the final section, May argues that the contemporary world requires a new supreme object of love. He embraces the Nietzschean dismissiveness towards religious love of God, but he also rejects romantic, sexual love as the best contemporary paradigm of love. Instead, he portrays parental love for one's child as the best paradigm of love as ontological rootedness. After all, neither romantic, sexual, nor marital love is unconditional or reliably lasting in contemporary culture. Yet, the problem with such love goes deeper. A change in priorities, values, and cultural tastes is more central to the paradigmatic shift towards parental love. To find a truly unconditional love, reflective love, that has nothing to do with any attribute of the beloved, whom we yet find an ontological home in, we must turn to parental love for one's child. After all, the choice to have children, or to embrace non-biological children as our own is a supreme act of self-defining autonomy. And it is an autonomy that binds the parent in a relationship of sheer responsibility, unlike the recklessness that is so often embodied in romantic love. It is a morally superior, far more selfless type of love. Furthermore, the parental love of a child is inherently 'open-ended' and without any point of completion, which previous conceptions of love have aimed at.

What should we think of May's account of love? It seems to me that what makes an account of love plausible and attractive is largely determined by what we want an account of love to accomplish and explain. Furthermore, our account of love must make sense within the complex pre-existing framework of our experiences and beliefs. Are we mainly interested in an account of love that explains erotic attraction, parental love for children, universal love for all, impartial moral values, Aristotelean style friendships rooted in virtue, religious ecstasy, or some other experience? Love is an unusually equivocal concept, with many plausible accounts that make sense given their own goals and broader philosophical commitments. This limitation is hardly a new problem, as demonstrated by Plato's Symposium where six shockingly divergent accounts of love are offered.

May offers an interesting and unique account within the assumptions of contemporary Nietzscheanism. Furthermore, he engages an impressively comprehensive range of both secular and religious sources from the Western canon. His account proceeds nicely from his own philosophical and cultural assumptions, and manages an impressive coherence within that context. Yet, he seems unaware of how narrow his own goals are and how narrowly encultured his own views seem to be.

For example, May's starting assumptions seem to be the ones popular in white, Anglo-American, college-educated, middle and upper-class circles. Let us start with his anti-religious Nietzschean assumptions: while he is quite right that the academic class in Anglo-American cultures often rejects religious influences, he makes no comment on the fact that about half of Anglo-American culture doesn't even accept this starting point. Nor does he seem to take seriously the fact that ninety percent of the global culture still embraces one religious view or another at least nominally. For those thinkers who still take some religious view of the world seriously, May's account of love as secularized agape will be easily rejected in favor of a religious account of agape. After all, the importance of agape in Western culture is overwhelmingly due to religion. So, for anyone who remains favorable towards religion, the older religious agape will probably be more attractive. Yet, if we discard the religious roots of agape, one might ask why we should retain agape at all? Why not return to embrace the eros of Platonism or the philial love of Aristotelean friendship? So, if one is looking for an account of love that proceeds from Nietzschean assumptions of upper class Anglo-American culture, May offers an interesting and attractive account. Yet, the audience sympathetic to such perspectives might be more limited than he acknowledges.

We might also question whether he misfires by attacking strawmen of some competing views. For example, May criticizes the view that love is based in physical beauty. But, does any non-adolescent truly, literally believe that love is based directly in physical beauty, such that we ought to love people in direct proportion to such beauty? I've never seen the view advocated in a serious academic sense. More often, such claims appear to be strictly metaphorical, made by young lovers who mean little more than that they find exceedingly entrancing beauty in their own beloved.

While each of May's four aspects of love is a joyful response to finding an 'ontological home' in another person are common experiences, I doubt that these are truly the essence of love. This is especially true of the claim that love involves finding 'shared values' with another person. This claim strikes me as quite pessimistic. Is there really no way to truly love someone whose values differ from us? What if our children rebel against the values we offer them? Would we stop truly loving them? Perhaps one might be disappointed or hurt or somewhat distanced from them, but I surely hope our love is deeper than May's view implies. While love may include a hope for full ontological connection in each of May's four areas, including values, there is inadequate room in his account for disappointed love, love despite distance and flaws, or unrequited love.

A final puzzle I am left with is May's odd claim that parenting has no final goal or consummation. Many parents think the goal of parenting is to succeed in bringing about a healthy, happy, virtuous, fully-functional adult. Thus, the consummation of parenting -- ironically -- is to see one's child succeed as an independent adult and to successfully embrace adult responsibilities such as moving out of the parent's home, graduating from college or vocational training, succeeding in one's first job, marrying, having children. So, oddly, it isn't that the parent has no final goal in his relationship with the child, but that the goal is largely to make one's self obsolete.

Despite these shortcomings, anyone who is interested in an engaging and unique account of love will find May's book worthwhile.