Love and Forgiveness for a More Just World

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Hent de Vries and Nils F. Schott (eds.), Love and Forgiveness for a More Just World, Columbia University Press, 2015, 243pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231170222.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Hanson, Harvard


There is an interesting and important philosophical discussion underway today on the topic of forgiveness, but this book makes little original contribution to it. The essays collected are not all to do with love and forgiveness (some are on the former, some on the latter, some have little to do with either), have their origin in a conference, and betray signs of this beginning.

The editors signal in their introduction that

If there were any one key idea that we seek to convey with the following essays, it is this: our (need for) alertness toward love and forgiveness in their often downright painful ambiguity, their connection (historically, conceptually, and practically speaking) as well as their no less telling disconnect, here and there (2).

Yet even this rather loosely constructed unifying thread does not supply much thematic consistency.

The collection is anchored by contributions from Jean-Luc Marion and Jacques Derrida. Marion's first, which opens the collection, reads like a transcribed set of remarks on love that summarize key points of his argument in The Erotic Phenomenon. Important though these themes are, they are available to readers of Marion in significantly more developed form already. His final reflections on forgiveness strike this reader as of more recent vintage and considerable interest, but again a fuller exploration is already available in Negative Certitudes. For this reader at least, Marion's essay most expressly links forgiveness and love in the fashion suggested by the volume title, though the sketch he provides seems idiosyncratic and not obviously related to the traditional expectation that forgiveness remits sin.

Of greater value are his reflections on "unpower," the possibility of a site that would be "neither a counterpower nor even an absence of power" (41). Marion's remarks on this topic (originally translated here from a 2008 interview) will certainly be relevant for thinking about love and forgiveness, but tracing out the full implications, philosophical and political, is work yet to be done. Likewise calling for further future clarification is Marion's failure to distinguish between reciprocity and equality; the persistent assumption among some French thinkers that reciprocity is a toxic effect could benefit from some sharp reexamination.

Regina M. Schwartz's contribution is a stimulating portion of a forthcoming book; her thoughts are sufficiently intriguing to make one want to read the entire work, but because this is only one portion thereof, concerns that may come up in the reader's mind have to be attenuated by the recognition that they may very well be addressed in the complete text. Mining Shakespeare's dramas for a critique of the impulse to revenge, Schwartz questions why it is that retribution remains so alluring. Her dismissals of certain rationalizations move a little too swiftly. Denying agency for example to those born to "crimogenic" conditions carries its own danger, as it shortchanges the potentially empowering effect of affirming agency in the face of admittedly difficult conditions (44).  Similarly, Aristotle's theory of punishment does not rest "on an enormous category mistake" that assumes the distribution of harm is identical to the distribution of goods (45).  Finally, while it is quite right that Plato insists that harm is always to be avoided, this does not prevent him from prescribing punishment (46). Defenders of the rehabilitative theory of punishment (if any remain) will wish that Schwartz had confronted more head-on the possibility of a non-vengeful form of punishment rather than tackle Robert Nozick alone. In some cases she elides distinctions that might otherwise complicate matters. For instance, in the Jewish tradition calling upon members of the community to witness my repentance for a crime done against someone dead and thus unable to forgive me (63) is not the same as assuming the burden of my ancestors' guilt, another now commonplace ethical move that is fraught with its own dangers (64). Her reading of Shakespeare is compelling though, and it ties together forgiveness and love with rather more force than many of the other contributions, and in the end she seems to come around to the possibility that punishment of a sort ("rebuke" she calls it after Maimonides) can be born of love.

Leora Batnitzky's contribution is an expanded version of a previously published piece that seeks to elucidate comparisons between Calvinism and Judaism. In the process she is able to effectively demonstrate that for certain traditions it is difficult to draw the typical distinction between love and law with any sharpness. The salient difference that remains between the two traditions that occupy her attention has, she argues, less to do with conceptions of God and more with conceptions of the human and in particular how to reconcile election with universalism (85-86). Co-editor Nils F. Schott's contribution traces out Augustine's account of how catechists can be formed into community. As is also the case for Batnitzky's essay, the historical investigation will be interesting to those who are invested in the particulars of these traditions, but the larger applicability of the findings to the questions ostensibly at hand is a bit unclear.

Similarly paired are two contributions by Orna Ophir and Albert Mason, both of whom draw on the thought of Melanie Klein. Whether they do so successfully, or indeed whether two commentaries on Klein are justifiable in one collection, is beyond the competence of this reviewer to assess.

The other "bookend" contributions come from Jacques Derrida, whose first piece is a transcript of two pages' length from a documentary made about him in 2005. The second is a republication of an interminable essay on forgiveness that originally appeared in John D. Caputo, Mark Dooley, and Michael J. Scanlon's 2001 collection Questioning God.

More intriguing but lamentably undeveloped are Sari Nusseibeh's suggestions about the importance of first principles in political reasoning. Drawing on Ibn Khaldūn, he suggests that it makes (or at least should make) a significant difference to the questions of peace and justice whether one assumes that love is the primal movement of human society or fear (as in a Hobbesian theory). Nusseibeh is refreshingly honest about the limits of what in-house philosophical discussions can accomplish, but he also leaves the reader with some insights that have potentially powerful implications for further discussion. In particular, he scores some valid points against Harry Frankfurt, most memorably in his claim that despite Frankfurt's efforts to delineate love,

though loved ones or objects constitute purposes in life, they are not, for that reason, loved. Nor, not having -- as loved objects -- intrinsic values in themselves to make them loved by us, should we assume that pursuing them makes us better persons: their pursuit gives meaning to our lives, but such meaning is morally neutral. (187).

That observation makes a key distinction of wider relevance than even the topic at hand and touches not least on a host of fascinating contemporary discussions about whether and how human life and its projects can (or even should) be unified by anything and whether such unity would also entail only the morally praiseworthy or itself be morally praiseworthy as opposed to a life of comparative dissipation and inconsistency. It applies equally to frustrations with Frankfurt's own account of such questions, which seems ultimately to run aground on a tautology about human desires. When pressed to say why we have the ones we have Frankfurt seems reduced to saying that we just do. Nusseibeh's pithy distinction here is one worth remembering in general, and it may help give a vocabulary to the vexations of some of Frankfurt's critics in particular. Nusseibeh certainly prefers to regard, following Khaldūn, self-love as a different species from other-love, but a more dialectical formulation is probably required in the end.

The final essay is from co-editor Hent de Vries. Probably the most sustained engagement in the volume, it is an impressive march through the increasingly central place that Marion has assigned in his thought to love. As de Vries concedes, this development is not at all surprising (195), but its full scope and significance has perhaps yet to be gauged in the secondary literature. Love, after all, was only reluctantly invoked by Levinas late in his career, and the general fear that the very idea has been worn down by sloppy overuse is widespread and has been voiced by Marion himself. De Vries does a good job of pointing up the key developments in Marion's recent writings, and he reconstructs the many ways in which the exploration of love is yet another extension of and elaboration upon Marion's overall project of opposing the ontotheological constitution of metaphysics (being is said in many ways, love in only one (197); love escapes both kataphasis and apophasis, submitting only to the way of eminence (197)).

De Vries hearkens back to the interview in this volume on "unpower," an internal connection between the essays that is too rare. Judging from his account, some of Marion's efforts to distance love from the structures of being sound too forced, in a way parallel to the pained separation of the gift from the ordinary strictures of objectivity that was elaborated at such length in the first part of Being Given. Similarly, the sincerity problem is one that has perhaps bedeviled the conversation for long enough. A more dialectical account of self-love might be required, inasmuch as it is presumably in my own interests as well as that of others' to not give too much quarter to this alleged objection. To return to Shakespeare, just think of the trouble that Lear could have been spared if he had trusted that Cordelia loved him just because she said so. This example would presumably capture something of Marion's conflation of the global and banal, supereminence achieved by meanest means. Nevertheless, de Vries's contribution is a significant study of an important topic that indeed clarifies the nature and role of love in Marion's philosophy and links it profitably to questions of performativity and pragmatics. Few today are rethinking love with as much acumen and depth as Marion, so attention to this topic is certainly rewarding.

Further discussion of the relationship love bears to forgiveness would be worthwhile, inasmuch as a recurrent if not always explicit concern of these essays is the manner in which love can be affirmed even when it seems inoperative or constrained. Everyone wants to assign the highest importance to love, but whether there are limits to its force or at least its practical implementation and whether those limits can be supplemented by forgiveness without compromising the primacy of love or the demands of justice remain disputed questions.