Love of a God of Love: Toward a Transformation of the Philosophy of Religion

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Hugo Strandberg, Love of a God of Love: Toward a Transformation of the Philosophy of Religion, Continuum, 2011, 218pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441182135.

Reviewed by Edward Vacek, S.J., Woodstock Theological Center, Georgetown University


Most books with "love" in their title do not examine in any depth the nature of love. Most books that urge loving God do not examine what it would mean to love God. Most books that describe God as a loving God do not explain what it would mean for God to love nor do they give a rationale why, in the face of so many alternative ascriptions and powerful objections, they think God should be described as a lover. Strandberg's book is no exception. This "oversight" is all the more surprising since the author, who teaches at the Abo Akademi University in Finland, is an extremely self-critical and probing thinker. It is also surprising since he proposes to refound the philosophical understanding of religion on the basis of love for a God of love. It is further surprising since he is careful to call attention to underlying issues, e.g., the existence of God. He is also anxious to point out many collateral questions such as the nature of miracles, the sources of theology, the role of argument, or the place of good works.

Nevertheless, in spite of all that carefulness, when it comes to the central thesis of the book, he simply asserts it. Indeed, he seems to suggest that no argument is either necessary or relevant. One either understands or one doesn't the thesis that religious belief means loving a God of love.

Scholars have struggled without consensus on at least three separate issues involved in this central thesis. First, what is the nature of love? Is it an emotion, an inner feeling, a set of practices, benevolence, beneficence, and so forth? Also does this love take distinctive forms such as eros, agape, philia, storge, and so forth? Is one kind of love more appropriate than another? Second, can human beings love God? Is, for example, such love reducible to obedience or to following God's plan in creation? Is it -- as perhaps is most commonly misunderstood -- reducible to love of neighbor or love of one's best self? Third, does God love? Or, even, can God love? For example, can an immutable God be affected by anything outside of God's own self? Or, can the plight of those who suffer affect a perfectly happy God? Strandberg skips these kinds of questions.

Nevertheless, Strandberg's central thesis is quite worthy of reflection. Where people commonly speak of belief in God, he holds that what they really mean, if they mean anything that is existential, is that they love a God of love. In this sense, to say that one believes that "God exists" is not to believe at all.

In developing his central thesis, Strandberg challenges what he considers to be the standard approach in the philosophy of religion. In that approach, he says, it is assumed that the content that any particular religion believes is clear and it is assumed that what it is to believe is clear. Strandberg pictures philosophers of religion as people who treat a body of religious beliefs as just so many objects for study.

In contrast, Strandberg espouses an approach that is more that of a theologian, even though he does not pursue theology at any length. Professional theologians, particularly when reflecting on "God," but also on most other elements of theology, fill libraries with searching, critical and conflicting studies on who God might be and on how we relate to God. Except perhaps when writing catechisms, they don't pretend to be able to provide a straightforward list of beliefs. Rather, they use language such as "mystery" or "ultimate" or "symbol" in order to make clear that they don't have clear and distinct ideas of God or most other aspects of their belief. Strandberg, however, merely denies the philosopher's approach without attempting to engage the complex project of a theologian.

Some philosophers of religion may presume they can achieve a reflective distance from the act of believing that makes both the contents of belief and the act of believing just clear objects for discussion. Strandberg opposes this sort of philosophizing. In doing so, he rightly and importantly makes a crucial observation, namely, that the object of our mind affects the way that we relate to that object. For example, while we can use the same word "love" to say we love hamburgers and we love art and we love wisdom and we love God, the existential act of love in each case is different. If we love our spouse with the "same" love that we love our cell phone, something is greatly amiss. Although Strandberg does not acknowledge that there may nevertheless be some intelligible core-meaning to the activity of love in each case, he is right to note the existential difference. Hence, he is quite right when he devotes his first chapter to asserting that belief and the content of belief ought not be wholly severed from one another, a mistaken practice he calls "formalism."

Another version of this formalism would be for a person to say she wholly and entirely loves God, but does not love any creatures. If a man claimed to be a lover of God but claimed no such love for a creature, Strandberg says, then either he is self-deceived about loving God, or he fails to recognize that the God he loves is involved, as a God of love, with these creatures. If he doesn't love at least one creature, he doesn't really love God. On the other hand, since none of us love all that God loves, it follows that none of us really love God. Strandberg makes this point by saying that those who believe should also admit that they do not believe, (49; however, cf. 55) presumably meaning that they do not wholly believe. He seems to want to make this point against any philosopher of religion who writes as if either people believe or they don't believe.

Somewhat unusually for a philosopher and more in line with the Lutheran evangelical heritage that historically has been dominant in his home country, Strandberg holds that for believers love is not something they do. It is not their act. They do not choose to love. Rather, they simply stop refusing it. That is, persons have the power to do evil, but not good. They do have the power to turn their back on God's love; but if they were to turn again to God, it would not be their deed but it would rather be the case that God's love so attracts them that they experience a conversion. Put another way, the act of love is a relation and thus depends on the one loved, and this is so to such an extent that instead of seeing such love as a deed of the believer it is now seen almost wholly from the side of that which one believes in, namely, God.

Similarly, since for Strandberg the believer begins already involved in a relation with God, philosophers of religion miss the mark when they think that the believer must first argue for or at least postulate the existence of God. The question of God's existence is irrelevant to the believer. The problem is that, when philosophers assert or deny that God exists, they speak as if there are no existential consequences in asserting God's existence. When the believer engages God's existence, however, she is really articulating where ultimate importance is for her.

The difference between the believer and the atheist is not that one says "Yes" and the other says "No" to an open question about God's existence. Rather, the difference is in their respective lives. For the believer, a good life already includes togetherness with God. In turn the believer just lives well, not in the calculating fashion of someone who does not love. That is, she does not do good in order to receive some reward. Put another way, if there were some alternative way for her to receive the same rewards or get the same results, she would not choose that alternative because getting the results is not the point of her living well. Rather it is a part of her loving a God of love.

Strandberg does not only hold that the believer begins within a love relationship. He additionally holds that those who claim that God does not exist will normally nevertheless be believers. For him, anyone who resists exploiting another in fact loves the soul of that other, even when that other is, say, a mountain. Since all objects are not isolated, anyone who respects some positive "weight" in some object is already a believer. That is, according to Strandberg, love of a single object is always also directed to something beyond and more all encompassing than the object, and that means it is love for God (64). This way of thinking -- it is not meant to be an argument -- seems slipshod. While some of our acts of love may involve an infinite self-transcendence, this is not true of all or even most of our loves.

When Standberg reflects on God's love for humans, he describes it as an activity of salvation. His Lutheran view is that God's salvific love involves no criteria. If God did have any criteria, it would not be love. The problem with this not uncommon theological approach is that it itself is a type of the formalism that Strandberg otherwise rejects. That is, it describes a love that is not affected or modified by its object. It is one thing to say that God will love Mike no matter what Mike does, so that in that sense whether or not God loves is independent of what Mike does. It is quite another to say that love for Mike is independent of who Mike uniquely is, or that God's love does not alter when Mike grows in goodness or sin. In other words, a proper understanding of God's love is that it is attuned to the beloved, which means that it is modified by who and how the beloved is.

Similarly, Strandberg tries to distinguish "togetherness" from "community," where the former occurs without any shared ideology or activity, while the latter requires ritual and common beliefs. Such a "togetherness," however, is a construct since humans do not just relate to a featureless other, but to the concrete other who shares or does not share in a common worldview, liturgical activities, and so forth.

Strandberg correctly strives to think within a relation between God and persons. But this approach can obscure how we humans also can and do begin with the particulars in our lives. An example of the different approaches can be seen in the way that Strandberg describes miracles. The standard approach is to start with all the things around us and their normal patterns, and then to see the miracle as an exception to these normal patterns. From a need to explain this exception, one typically argues that God is its cause. Strandberg suggests that we start instead within the love relationship with God. He then notes that, to the lover of God, all things are already always related to God. Hence, everything is a miracle, and there is no need to explain any exceptions. The problem with this approach, however, is that it leaves unanswered the legitimate question why something is an exception as well as the question why there are not more of these exceptions if God so loves us.

An analogous approach to the problem of evil suggests itself to Strandberg. Using Wittgensteinian analysis, he tries to show that there is no "philosophical" problem of evil. A proper understanding of language reveals that philosophers mistakenly see a contradiction when they contrast God's goodness, power, and the issue of evil. Rather, Strandberg holds, God's omnipotence refers to the power of love, and the "omni" of this love excludes no one. Hence, once we start already within a relationship of love with God, the classical problem of evil cannot arise (147). While a negative event may seem to some outsiders to be meaningless, to the believer it already plays a part in the relationship with God.

Throughout, Strandberg engages in what he calls thinking, which he distinguishes from arguing. It is clear throughout the book that he is not much interested in arguing for the positions that he proposes. Rather, his method is closer to assertion and retortion. He takes a position, most centrally the position that belief really means love of a God of love. Then he considers numerous ways in which this may be misunderstood. He is not so interested in illuminating its meaning, explaining how it must be understood, or developing its implications.

Indeed, his fundamental writing style reveals much about the way he proceeds. I estimate that the number of times the word "not" appears in this book is greater than the total number of sentences the book contains. Often even the sentences that avoid the word "not" nevertheless have phrases like "it is unclear." Strandberg's penchant for negation makes for difficult reading. Moreover, many of the points that he warns against are points that few would ever think of raising. On the other hand, sentences which claim that some point is obvious are often not at all obvious. Strandberg takes the reader on side tangents that also seem to have only slight bearing on the topic. For example, the classic sources for theology turn into a question of authority, and that question is resolved by asserting that if one loves another person that person is one's authority. At other times, he will suggest that there are many items related to his topic, but then he pursues only one or two, and even then often not the most important items.

The prose of this book requires extra effort of the reader. Still, the book powerfully challenges ordinary ways of thinking about religious belief. It whittles away at many assumptions and conventional positions. Its theme of beginning within a relationship with God has much to commend it. But such an approach does not eliminate, as Strandberg seems to think, the importance and pertinence of the conventional starting points and difficult questions that still perplex many. To be told that one's usual approach and questions can be dissolved as irrelevant or meaningless sometimes is freeing, but more often it is to be left perplexed.