Love, Reason, and Will: Kierkegaard After Frankfurt

Placeholder book cover

Anthony Rudd and John Davenport (eds.), Love, Reason, and Will: Kierkegaard After Frankfurt, Bloomsbury, 2015, 290pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781628927313.

Reviewed by Elizabeth Murray, Loyola Marymount University


John Davenport and Anthony Rudd’s edited volume provides an excellent contribution to Kierkegaardian scholarship and to current debates surrounding Harry Frankfurt’s seminal thought. As C. Stephen Evans comments in his blurb on the cover, “This is one of the few books that will truly bridge the ‘analytic-continental’ divide in contemporary philosophy.” Yet, the ‘bridging’ is neither explicit nor forced. The eleven contributors draw on a wide range of historical and contemporary thinkers in interpreting Frankfurt’s and Kierkegaard’s accounts of love. They demonstrate openness to pursue questions where they lead, and they display generosity in their charitable readings of the accounts of others. The fact that the authors in many cases have read and comment on each other’s contribution to the volume adds dialogical depth. A number of the essays are beautifully written and moving (even uplifting) as well as philosophically and existentially challenging. I can foresee a number of then becoming ‘classics’ assigned repeatedly in coming years in graduate and undergraduate courses.

The editors’ informative Introduction provides a synopsis of the three main sections of the book and each of the essays. Section I: “Love and the Ground of Love” deals with the fundamental problem of the relation of love and value. Is value bestowed on the object by our caring/loving, or is our loving a response to the inherent value of the object? Its four essays, by Charles Taliaferro, Alan Soble, Troy Jollimore, and Davenport, tackle this issue in different ways, highlighting numerous facets of the nature of love and of the accounts of Frankfurt and Kierkegaard. This question threads throughout the book; most of the essays in the next two sections touch on this issue in some way. Section 2: “Love and Self-Love” comprises essays by Sylvia Walsh, John Lippitt, and Marilyn G. Piety. In this section there is discussion of the distinction made by both Kierkegaard and Frankfurt between improper self-love and proper (genuine) self-love. Frankfurt’s claim that self-love is the paradigm of love is contrasted with Kierkegaard’s view that self-transcending love of neighbor is the model of love. Section 3: “Love and Its Reasons” contains essays by Annemarie van Stee, M. Jamie Ferreira, Rick Anthony Furtak, and Rudd. The authors focus on a variety of topics including self-constitution through intrapersonal and interpersonal relations, the necessities of love, the ground of practical reason, and the relation of love and morality. The issue of freedom and determinism comes to the fore with analysis of Frankfurt’s evolutionary biological determinism. The volume concludes with a return to the question of the objectivity of the ground of love.

The editors state in the ‘Introduction’: “this collection is not a dichotomous debate between partisans of Kierkegaard on the one side and of Frankfurt on the other” (4). They see the book rather as potentially enriching for both the current debates surrounding Frankfurt’s approach and for the resurgent interest in Kierkegaard. The volume succeeds in examining love in its various forms from a variety of angles, and in demonstrating significant points of agreement between Frankfurt and Kierkegaard. The collection is not framed as a debate, nevertheless a fundamental divide separating Frankfurt and Kierkegaard becomes ever more apparent as one reads the book. Most all of the authors discuss fundamental differences in the viewpoints or accounts of the two thinkers. Ferreira is explicit about the opposition when she writes: “there is a chasm between Frankfurt and Kierkegaard on the question of the relevance of the content and the value of the object of love”(199). In the following I will discuss how the issue of the relation of love and value, which runs throughout this volume manifests this chasm.

Piety (“The Fullness of Faith: Frankfurt and Kierkegaard on Self-Love and Human Flourishing”) quotes a passage from Kant’s Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, concerning his notion of moral conversion (164-5). This revolution in the disposition of the self, which Kant distinguishes from gradual reform, is a transition from merely conforming legally to the good to actually being morally good. Piety discusses how Kierkegaard finds this account inadequate, but nevertheless, she employs this notion of a moral/religious conversion in her evaluation of Frankfurt’s account of self-love.

In my discussion of the question of the relation of value and love I will also employ a notion of conversion, specifically, Bernard Lonergan’s notion of three forms of conversion: intellectual, moral, and religious. In short, intellectual conversion is a shift from the standpoint of naïve realism through idealism to critical realism; moral conversion is a shift from being self-centered to being value-centered; and religious conversion is falling in love with God.1 Authenticity, for Lonergan, is a function of the presence or absence of these conversions. This notion of authenticity serves as the criterion in his dialectical method of interpreting viewpoints. In “Frankfurt and Kierkegaard on BS, Wantonness, and Aestheticism: A Phenomenology of Inauthenticity” Davenport approaches his critique of Frankfurt’s account indirectly by examining both Kierkegaard and Frankfurt on forms of inauthenticity. But in order to do this, he first provides a concise but detailed account of the nature of existential authenticity, its five essential characteristics and its two levels (76-81). Davenport’s employment of his phenomenology of existential authenticity in his interpretation of Frankfurt has emboldened me to introduce Lonergan’s notion of authenticity as a function of conversion.

All the essays in Section I “Love and the Ground of Love” and a number of the later ones raise the question of whether there is objective value or significance inherent in objects (especially other human beings) independently of our valuing them, or whether value accrues to objects and persons only by virtue of our acts of caring and loving. Soble, in “Love and Value, Yet Again,” summarizes the history of the question from Plato and Augustine to Anders Nygren and Irving Singer. With Augustine we can ask, do I love him because he is beautiful, or do I think he is beautiful because I love him? Singer characterizes the disjunction as “love as a response to antecedent, independent value, and… love as essentially the attribution or creation of value.”(26)

Frankfurt’s own position on the issue is stated clearly in the following passage quoted by Soble:

It need not be a perception of value in what he loves that moves the lover to love it. The truly essential relationship between love and the value of the beloved goes in the opposite direction. It is not necessarily as a result of recognizing their value and of being captivated by it that we love things [and people]. Rather, what we love necessarily acquires value for us because we love it. 2

Because who or what one loves is not grounded in any objective value or good, Frankfurt argues that genuine self-love is compatible with loving what is bad, what is evil. What makes self-love genuine in part for him is wholeheartedness. So, I suppose one could single-mindedly love his gun collection and love being an active member of the KKK. What matters, for Frankfurt, is that his ‘loving’ is wholehearted (198-99). For Frankfurt one lives a meaningful and enjoyable life as long as one willingly commits to one’s loves, which are simply given, determined by some mix of evolutionary biology and one’s concrete situation. This is reminiscent of Aristotle’s description of the vicious man in the Nicomachean Ethics, VII, who enjoys his life much like the virtuous man. Both have no inner struggle or regrets, because their actions are in line with their desires (right or wrong) and their universal knowledge (or lack of it), unlike the wretched man of moral weakness who is at odds with himself. (Of course, this does not mean that the vicious man is genuinely happy, for Aristotle.)

As Ferreira writes, Kierkegaard stands on the other side of the chasm on this question, because for him “normative human love is love of the good” (198-99). Walsh in “The Dear Self: Self-Love, Redoubling, and Self-Denial” draws from Works of Love to portray Kierkegaard’s view of true self-love and proper love of another, of one’s neighbor. Proper or true love of another requires loving the other as another self (redoubling), not as an extension of oneself, but as another independent, eternal self qualified as spirit. This love is based on the duty to love, which does not arise from one’s own inexplicable heart or psyche, but from divine authority. In fact, true love involves a triad of the self, the other and God. The self is related to (is loved by and loves) God; the other is related to (is loved by and loves) God, and the self and the other are in a relation of mutual love (122-23). This love of neighbor for Kierkegaard requires self-sacrifice and self-denial. Lippitt in the following essay “Giving ‘The Dear Self’ Its Due: Kierkegaard, Frankfurt, and Self-Love” finds Walsh’s emphasis on self-denial an exaggerated take on Kierkegaard, and seeks to mitigate her negative emphasis with an articulation of Kierkegaard on forgiveness, trust, and hope. Yet, I do not find Walsh’s focus on self-denial and self-sacrifice in love to be unwarranted. We recall that in Fear and Trembling Kierkegaard’s de Silentio makes infinite resignation a necessary though not a sufficient step, towards faith, towards the religious standpoint. Self-transcendence is essential to love, and it is essential to true forms of forgiveness, hope, and trust. To love God, to love oneself, and to love one’s neighbor is to follow the way of the cross.

In this brief sketch of Kierkegaard’s account of love, we can detect both moral and religious conversion. In loving the other in all his particularity, the self transcend his or her own egocentrism, and this love is not a matter of one’s own inclinations but of duty. Furthermore, the ground of this duty to love is God, whose very being is love.

Even though none of the authors are explicitly focused in this volume on questions of cognition and epistemology, their ultimate positions on the question of the relation of love and value rest upon their implicit notions of objectivity. A variety of basic positions on objectivity emerge: (1) dogmatic, naïve idealism as in Plato; (2) dogmatic, naïve realism as in Aristotle; (3) naïve empiricist subjectivism as in Frankfurt (4) critical idealism as in Kant; (5) critical subjectivism as in Sartre; and (6) ‘critical realism’ as in Kierkegaard and Max Scheler. What naïve idealism (1) and naïve idealism (2) have in common is the presupposition of objective reality and value as already there, independent of the self, not constituted by the self. But, while Plato affirms an objective Good, naïve empiricist subjectivism (3) as in Frankfurt, influenced by the Humean tradition, presupposes an objective, value-free reality that is already out there: real, not constituted by the human mind, upon which one projects one’s own significance, meaning, and value. What critical idealism (4) introduces is the turn to the subject as constituting the world of our experience — Kant’s ‘second Copernican revolution’. Although Kant did not ultimately transcend immanentism in his account of human knowing, his moral theory is not prone to subjectivism or relativism. The a priori law of reason is the ground of objective moral judgments, the ground of affirming, for example, the absolute worth (value) of every human being. With critical subjectivism (5) we have a post-Kantian, phenomenological worldview, which recognizes how the self constitutes phenomena including value. This constitution, however, is no longer grounded in the a priori, so there is no universality or necessity to one’s valuations. Morality becomes relative, and values become subjective and arbitrary. The final position, that of critical realism (6) arrives at the objectivity of values through the ground of subjectivity. Scheler affirms an a priori foundation of ethics, not Kant’s formal law of reason but the a priori hierarchy of values, the order of the heart. Kierkegaard maintains a post-Kantian view of consciousness as constituting one’s world. For example, the sophisticated aesthete of “The Rotation Method” in Either/Or declares: “One who has perfected himself in the twin arts of remembering and forgetting is in a position to play at battledore and shuttlecock with the whole of existence.” And, for Kierkegaard, objective truth is a function of authentic subjectivity.3 In addition to revealing a partial intellectual conversion,4 Kierkegaard’s position on the objectivity of value reflects his religious conversion, his faith in the goodness of God’s creation.

Furtak  (“Love as the Ultimate Ground of Practical Reason: Kierkegaard, Frankfurt, and the Conditions of Affective Experience”) seeks a kind of middle ground between Platonic objectivism and Sartrean subjectivism. The former asserts that values are objective and independent of human caring or loving; the latter asserts that human caring and loving create values. These two options form a false dichotomy. Love is a response to the other as valuable, and through loving the other we are able to perceive values that would otherwise remain hidden. Furtak writes: “The fact that love makes us aware of the significance of things does not necessarily entail that this significance is projected onto the world by our own minds”(221). He presents the analogy that Kierkegaard draws between the power of sight to reveal colors and the power of love to reveal value: “it is only ‘if you yourself have loved’ that you know what it is like to experience the world in this light, in the same way that ’the blind person cannot know color differences” (228). In Kierkegaard’s view, then, the good or value is inherent in the other and in the world objectively, and the more we love the more we can perceive this goodness in the world and especially in the other loved in all his particularity. To love another self is to love the individual not a universal or a set of universal values found in the other. If one’s beloved were to ask, what is it that you love about me? The answer, for Kierkegaard, would be You. I might add that loving the other does not only enable us to see what is valuable in the other, the act of loving can bring about a transformation in the other. This is especially the case for children, whose very selves are formed through the love of their parents and others who love them. It is equally the case that the act of loving transforms the one loving.

In conclusion, I have focused on one central issue that is woven throughout the volume, the relation of value and love, but I could have chosen other points of comparison. The nature of self-love in relation to other forms of love is the focus of a number of the essays. Another critical point of comparison is the issue of freedom and determinism. Frankfurt argues for a compatibilism, which accepts both evolutionary biological determinism and the role of voluntary choices and commitments. Kierkegaard insists on radical human freedom and possibility as constitutive of the self, while he also includes finitude and necessity as constitutive of the self. He characterizes determinism generally as a mode of despair, and truncated possibility as despair in the form of bourgeois Philistinism.

I have not had the space in this review to discuss each of the essays, so my apologies to those who were not included. I barely scratched the surface of the essays I did discuss. My discussion of the issue of the relation of love and value will have to suffice to at least give the reader a taste of the riches contained in this important, scholarly collection.

1 Lonergan, Method in Theology (1972) (University of Toronto Press, 1990, pp. 235-266.

2 Frankfurt, The Reasons of Love (Princeton University Press, 2004), pp. 33-39, quoted p. 27.

3 See Kierkegaard’s “Truth as Subjectivity” in CUP; see also the phrase from Kierkegaard’s Journals quoted by Furtak, “Objectivity which takes shape in a corresponding subjectivity,” 221.

4 Lonergan defines intellectual conversion more thoroughly including the essential element of the virtually unconditioned and judgment, which is not found in Kierkegaard.