LoveKnowledge: The Life of Philosophy from Socrates to Derrida

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Roy Brand, LoveKnowledge: The Life of Philosophy from Socrates to Derrida, Columbia University Press, 2012, 144pp., $24.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780231160445.

Reviewed by Jeremy David Bendik-Keymer, Case Western Reserve University


Books that discuss love should start with the logic of love. The main trap is to model love on desire. When one does, love's logic is fundamentally monadic, not bipolar, to use Michael Thompson's terminology.[1] This means that love can come from one, rather than existing between two as their relation. It also means that love can have objects, rather than always being between people or personas, an error that grounds much psychoanalytic misunderstanding of love. Finally, when love is modeled on desire, love can be bound up with evaluation, with "seeing" the beloved in "the best possible light" (emphasis added).[2] For the most part, understanding love as bound up with evaluation commits one to the domain of practical reason and to practical desire. But the odd thing about love -- which philosophy is only beginning to grasp -- is that love is not desire; it is not monadic; and it is only indirectly related to anything practical. Love is relational, between two people, and in itself has nothing to do with evaluation, objects, or what I want.[3]

Roy Brand's down to earth, readable book directly conflates love with desire, and the result hinders what he can do with his topic. Before explaining this criticism, however, I want to frame what Brand is doing, explain how he does it, and highlight the strengths of his approach. I say, "what Brand is doing," because Brand's book is not an argument for a thesis. It is a way of handling a topic, a set of performances (p. ix-xi) that model a habit of mind, even a way of life (p. x). The book's topic is the "practice" (p. xi) called "loveknowledge" -- Brand's translation of "philosophy." His book is an introduction to philosophy showing how philosophy is an ethos. Its distinctiveness from other introductions to the practice of philosophy[4] resides in what the neologism "loveknowledge" hopes to convey:

what is the love that turns into knowledge and how is the knowledge we seek already a form of love? (p. x).

Although the logic of these questions is confusing, Brand defines "loveknowledge" as the "struggle" between love and knowledge framed in this way:

There is no love without knowledge and no knowledge without love. Love without knowledge becomes more like an animal drive, and knowledge without love is reduced to a simple search for information. The two are necessary [for philosophy], but they do not form a harmonious couple. Their struggle, which we here callloveknowledge, defines us as humans and their particular configuration in each of us makes us who we are (p. 20).

So Brand believes (1) there is a particular kind of dynamism between love and knowledge that constitutes philosophy, and (2) the form this dynamism takes defines us as the people we are. Since he doesn't claim that only "loveknowledge" defines us, he believes that (3) whether we recognize it or not, the way we practice philosophy with respect to the tension between love and knowledge not only determines, say, our philosophical style or doctrines, but the way we are people. "Loveknowledge" is a dynamic constituting every practicing philosopher's particular humanity, which Brand often calls the "self" (p. 13). So this is quite a substantial claim about the nature of philosophy, even though Brand does not take himself to be pursuing a thesis.

It's worth pausing to note how Brand's claim about the power of philosophy relates LoveKnowledge to Martha Nussbaum's Love's Knowledge.[5] Like Brand's, Nussbaum's book contained a meta-philosophical argument to the effect that philosophy ought to take both love and the practice of literary reading seriously. Moreover, like Brand, Nussbaum took love and the practice of reading to be intimately bound up: she argued that it takes love to read of humans perceptively, and she argued that reading of humans perceptively refines one's capacity to love. However, Brand's book is committed to the stronger claim that philosophy is a practice of loveknowledgeand that, more markedly, this practice defines the self of each person practicing it. Unlike Nussbaum's famous study, Brand's is after a source of the self in philosophy.

There's a tacit hermeneutics of the self here that settles into the idea of "personal philosophy" (p. 56). Brand's "readings" (p. x) begin with Plato's Apology and Symposium, turn to Spinoza's Ethics and Rousseau's Reveries of the Solitary Walker, continue with Nietzsche's Genealogy of Morals and Foucault's History of Sexuality, and end with a discussion of Brand's teacher, Jacques Derrida. The Apology provides Brandt with a practice of knowledge that is fundamentally "care of the self" (p. 19). The Symposium supplements this knowledge with the love that is needed to make a person grow "in the company of others" (p. 33). The Ethics provides the category of "intellectual love" whereby self-knowledge becomes love of one's own life's "striving" (p. 51) in the context of its whole universe with all its life-affirming relations. The Reveries shows how autobiography -- "writ[ing] oneself" (p. 67) -- allows one to deepen one's sense of one's own experience both by reconstructing and communicating it, opening it up to care in the reconstruction and "friendship" in the communication (p. 72).

The Genealogy of Morals accentuates what such personal philosophy is:

to take philosophy back from the heights of abstraction to the everyday where thinking is alive -- where it smells, hurts, provokes, and gives joy (p. 73).

This embodied, emotional -- and so value-laden -- relationship to knowledge is purportedly a consequence of understanding how much desire is operative in the interpretations we make into -- and gradually take as -- settled reality (p. 80, 84). Brand takes Nietzsche's genealogical method to show the movement of desire-laden interpretation into "fact" (p. 80) and his "perspectivism" to be an awareness of this pragmatic nature of knowledge, where

the way to judge between interpretations is not by relating them to some independent criterion but by relating them to ourselves -- to the kind of life they shape (p. 93).

This kind of pragmatic and personal judgment handles, for Nietzsche, "the problem of our times -- knowledge and love come apart to such an extent that the more we know, the less we care about life (p. 74)." But such "nihilism" (p. 89) disappears once what we claim to know shapes a life we care to live.

Besides providing the historical relevance of Brand's focus on "loveknowledge," Nietzsche is also the hinge in Brand's hermeneutics. He credits Nietzsche with noticing that self-knowledge is impossible, because "we cannot see around ourselves" (p. 79). So Socrates's method of knowing himself with others becomes grounded, as does the supplement of love that pulls us outside ourselves even when we don't want to know. Even Spinoza's objective detachment and impersonal distancing seem logical, if unsatisfactory, and Rousseau's seemingly paradoxical interpellation through writing makes sense. Brand's chapter on Foucault, accordingly, focuses on "becoming other" (p. 94). It takes off from Nietzsche's idea that "free spirits" "make room for others because they are constantly in the process of becoming other to themselves" (p. 93).

Brand focuses on Foucault's reading of the Symposium,

a story about how humans shape themselves in the presence of another person's desire, how the experience of being desired by another is internalized and how self-experience is changed in the process (p. 103).

Following Foucault, Brand's question is whether there can be some form of desire that breaks with the repressive "matrix" of "power-knowledge" that is institutionalized in the modern world (p. 95), shaping both what is considered desirable and what is worth knowing. Not surprisingly, he suggests that "loveknowledge" is capable of doing this (p. 110), waiting until his final chapter on Derrida to suggest how (p. 119ff.). There, following Derrida's eulogy to Emmanuel Levinas, Brand claims that giving one's attention to another without "calculation" (p. 127) and communicating around the interpretation of what matters to each of you ends up giving the other room to make meaning (p. 126). Even if your interpretation brushes against the grain of another's, uncovering tensions or groundless moments in it, the hold of power-knowledge loosens in this space of subdued intellectual love, and the idea of communication beyond the letter of the law is valorized. Others then give us room to make sense of our lives by giving themselves openly to what moves them in what moves us.


As an introduction to philosophy, LoveKnowledge has six strengths. (1) Brand's readings suggest dialectical movement. "Love" and "knowledge" flip, turn, and merge with each other in different interpretations of different philosophers. Though the terms are not precisely defined, Brand's use of them in different contexts should create dialectical discussions among people talking over the readings in Brand's book. (2) Brand understands the ethical as a way of life, not as a set of principles or even virtues. This allows him to understand each of the philosophies of his subjects as an ethos. They become alive, full, and accessible. (3) In all the texts he reads, Brand thinksloveknowledge leads us to accept who we are as ordinary people, since that is where we honestly find ourselves. "There is no special gift that philosophy requires" (p. 118). "[Derrida] stands alone in the kitchen spreading butter on bread or watching TV" (p. 118). (4) By emphasizing "performance and effect" (p. ix), Brand's readings remind us that we are doing something with a book -- or a "Nook"-- when we read him or those he discusses. Life-with-book is part of the ethos of philosophy and that in turn allows us to think about the wider context of what we do when we "loveknowledge," i.e., sit-in-classroom (yawn) or serve-community. (5) Even though he is stuck on making love desire (Chapter 2), many of Brand's readings draw attention to how whatever is loving in philosophy happens between people.

It would be so interesting to see how LoveKnowledge would change if love were not conflated with desire, how much of philosophy would be opened up. That late in the book Brand adopts a "Socratic" conception of desire according to which desire is desire of an absence, not of an object (p. 107), doesn't change the illogic. Love is an interpersonal relation that takes people as people and never as objects or their negation (absences). A person is the opposite of an object, not its negation, and it is only in the logic of love that we are persons at all. In the logic of truth-seeking, we are subjects, and in the logic of action, we are agents. What has to be marked out clearly in love is the logic of relational -- neither practical nor theoretical -- reason. And desire is a mark of the practical.[6]

To interpret what Brand explores through the logic of love would demand beginning with the interpersonal and with how people-in-work are called to connect with each other in order to become, simply, people. We'd need to take up the position of a relation that is separate from either person and which has a life of its own. We'd need to understand how the knowing that holds of each other between people is neither know-how nor knowledge-that. Many things would need to be reconsidered, including the ways in which each of Brand's texts fails to lead us to become people, even as each text has elements that support such a search when read critically in light of relational reason. Overall, reinterpreting Odysseus, we'd have to see "the human of many ways" whose wisdom, whatever there be, is in the balance -- like the charioteer negotiating the wild horses of Plato's Phaedrus -- not of appetites but of modes of being: relating, acting, thinking in beauty, goodness and truth.


(6) The greatest strength of Brand's book is that it is humble, an uncommon virtue among academic philosophers. Not once in reading his book, despite its at times confusing logic and its at times summary passages, did I feel that he dissuaded me at all from wanting to go back and take another look at the books he read. Many times, I felt pulled to go back and crack the cover of one of the books, even though I had previously no intention to dust it off. In other words, his introduction has the right touch, and I can imagine it being useful to students and others -- family members, people one meets out on the town -- curious about philosophy. Moreover, I think it would be a good guide for a reading group -- not deciphering the books, but staging them for discussion. The book is lovely in its own way.

[1] Thompson, M. (2004). "What Is It to Wrong Someone? A Puzzle about Justice." In R. Jay Wallace, P. Pettit, S. Scheffler & M. Smith (eds.), Reason and Value: Themes from the Moral Philosophy of Joseph Raz. Clarendon Press. 333-384.

[2] A leitmotif in Furtak, R. (2005). Wisdom in Love: Kierkegaard and the Ancient Quest for Emotional Integrity. University of Notre Dame Press. Of course, in Works of Love Kierkegaard distinguished between two kinds of love -- desiring love and unconditional love of the neighbor. At times, he even called love "the third" (i.e., a relationship separate from what either just you or just I want). But he didn't explain what makes the two kinds both love, conflating two logical forms under one term.

[3] Outside of some psychotherapeutic traditions such as family-systems theory, the "Continental" philosophical tradition has made the most advances in articulating love's logic. However, lacking a grasp of relational reason as a distinct ontological process has hindered this tradition. Badiou, for instance, in one of his earlier definitions of love, does insist that love depends on "two" and never "one" (Badiou, A. (1996). "What Is Love?" J. Clemens, trans. Umbr(a): One. 37-53). But by subjecting love to "truth" as a "truth-procedure," Badiou conflates the logic of love with theoretical reason, something he also does with practical reason when he translates the "Good" as the "True" (Badiou, A. (2011). Second Manifesto for Philosophy. L. Burchill, trans. Polity Press. 105-106). How ironic that Badiou is a monist when it comes to how we are human.

[4] E.g. Rosenberg, J. (1995). The Practice of Philosophy. 3rd edition. Prentice-Hall.

[5] Nussbaum, M. (1992). Love's Knowledge. Essays on Philosophy and Literature. Oxford University Press.

[6] Levinas glimpsed how the interpersonal relation sets personhood in his (1998) Otherwise than Being or Beyond Essence. A. Lingis, trans. Duquesne University Press. But he didn't grasp the logic of relational reason. Yet the lacuna accounts for the alternating criticism of both theory and practice in his phenomenology and explains some of the oddities of his work, such as when the body and emotion are reached for as antidotes to theory. Relational terms are approximated here. Perhaps the "Analytic" work of people like Stephen Darwall (2006) The Second Person Standpoint: Morality, Respect, and Accountability (Harvard University Press) will help over time, although it too lacks a grasp of relational reason.