Luck Egalitarianism

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Kasper Lippert-Rasmussen, Luck Egalitarianism, Bloomsbury, 2016, 259pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781472570420.

Reviewed by Annabelle Lever, University of Geneva


This brilliant and challenging book provides an overview and defence of 'luck egalitarianism', one that helpfully connects debates on luck egalitarianism to debates on what aspects of our lives egalitarians should try equalise (the 'equality of what?' debate/the debate on the 'metric' of equality) and on what respect, if any, it makes sense to see each other as equals. The book illuminates different conceptions of luck, as found in the philosophical literature, clarifies the difference between telic and deontic equality, and explains the 'levelling down' problem and the way that this affects luck egalitarians, and egalitarians more generally. For these reasons, the book provides a handy introduction to a range of philosophical debates about equality amongst analytic philosophers, whether or not one is particularly interested in luck egalitarianism. However, this is not an easy book to read, and while it is advertised as suitable for advanced undergraduates, I find it hard to imagine using it in any undergraduate course I have taught in the United States, England, France or Switzerland. But this is definitely a book that masters and doctoral students should be able to read by themselves and that will be helpful for teachers preparing classes on luck egalitarianism or on equality more generally.

The aim of the book is to provide a clear presentation and defence of luck egalitarianism, as describing a sufficient condition for distributive injustice (3). In chapter 7, which addresses Elizabeth Anderson's famous critique of luck egalitarianism, and the position of 'social relations egalitarians', such as David Miller, Samuel Scheffler, Jonathan Wolff and Anderson, Kasper Lippert-Rasmussen argues that luck egalitarianism comes in many variants and that while some of these are, indeed, incapable of incorporating social egalitarian insights into the value of a society without 'fawning and scraping', this is not a general truth about luck egalitarianism.

The varieties of luck egalitarianism, as a theory of distributive justice, play a critical role in Lippert-Rasmussen's book, and appear to explain the very particular formulation of the 'core luck egalitarian claim': 'it is unjust if some people are worse off than others through their bad luck'. (1) This core claim provides 'a sufficient condition for a distribution to be unjust', but allows that there may be other sources of unjust distributions (for example, exploitation that is freely entered into by the exploited person), and that injustice in distributions is not the only form of injustice that we might worry about (for example, we may be troubled by anti-Semitism or racism even if no distributions of goods are affected by them). (3) Above all, and more surprisingly, perhaps, 'the core luck egalitarian claim does not say that it is unjust if some are better off than others through their good luck'. (4) So the core luck egalitarian thesis is primarily concerned with distributive disadvantages generated by bad luck and, to that extent, is not a complete theory of distributive justice.

We can see, then, that luck egalitarians (like other philosophers) are likely to distinguish themselves by their views of what we are entitled or forbidden to distribute amongst persons (eyes, trees, land, paintings, education, money etc.); as well as the range of people to whom just distributions apply (fellow citizens, people in distant lands, children and animals, Martians), and with the ways that they understand the combination of disadvantage and the alternatives to luck as a distributive principle. But while the latter two issues are discussed extensively, the former is ignored more or less entirely. But how bad it is to be less advantaged than others by bad luck surely depends on what sorts of things are appropriately treated as subject to distributive justice and what factors other than principles of distributive justice might affect one's wellbeing, social standing and liberties. It will surely be bad to suffer bad weather luck if I live in a society where I must grow my own food to survive, and must depend on good weather to do so. But I may be much less troubled by bad weather if I have other ways to access food than growing it myself, by giving something else in exchange for food -- such as philosophy lectures, help with gardening or baby-sitting -- or by claiming food benefits from the government. I may therefore be much less inclined to suppose that my bad luck is itself a matter of justice rather than an unfortunate fact of life, or a basis for claims of solidarity, charity, or sympathy. So it is hard to test one's intuitions about the core claim, absent a discussion of the distribuenda of distributive justice.

Two other questions arise from the extremely interesting discussion of equality. The first concerns the use of 'bad luck' as an explanation of unjust inequalities in distribution. This is a question that applies to all luck egalitarians. The second question is specific to Lippert-Rasmussen's own formulation of luck egalitarianism, and his claim that the correct metric of equality is the 'satisfaction of individuals' reasonable non-instrumental concerns' xiii and ch. 4 more generally).

According to Lippert-Rasmussen, 'While being born black is not in itself an instance of bad luck, under Apartheid it was an instance thereof'. (2) Likewise, he thinks, 'being worse off as a result of a genetically caused disability seems like a paradigm case of being worse off as a result of bad luck and, thus, like racist inequalities in South Africa under Apartheid, a paradigm of injustice according to luck egalitarianism'. (2) What is striking here is the way that 'bad luck' is treated as the explanation for morally troubling disadvantages, rather than other factors -- the government of South Africa, the effects of industrial policy, or the lack of environmental protections and so on. Yet, so one might think, the injustice of apartheid simply is that it licenses advantages to people because they had white skin, and disadvantages to those who counted as 'coloured' or as 'black'. Even if one could have chosen to be born white rather than black, apartheid would be unjust because it implied that not being white is a sufficient ground for denying people basic rights, liberties and opportunities. It is hard to know, then, what importance to attach to the fact that one does not choose to be born (let alone choose the skin colour of one's parents) when thinking about the injustice of apartheid. But, off-hand, it is unclear that we get a more perspicuous sense of the paradigmatically unjust features of apartheid by interpreting its injustice in terms of 'luck', rather than by other means.

Likewise for the case of genetic disabilities. Not all cases of genetic disadvantage can be attributed to the wrongful behaviour of others. However, some can, and this suggests that talk of 'luck' as the descriptively essential feature of the injustice of being born genetically disadvantaged is far more controversial than Lippert-Rasmussen implies, as it risks obscuring and mischaracterising behaviour (and its consequences) that are unquestionably unjust, whatever your views on luck egalitarianism. No one, I assume, would doubt that (severe) genetic disadvantages are morally troubling because of their catastrophic effects on people's lives, as well as the relative disadvantages that they entail, however they arise. But why is it illuminating to think of one's bad genetic luck as an injustice? After all, one of the reasons to describe something as unjust is to ascribe wrongdoing (the wrongful violation of moral or legal rights) to others -- whether or not they are able to redress or compensate the wrong. But if there is no one to blame for my genetic misfortune, (and therefore my disadvantaged status relative to you), why describe my bad luck as an injustice? Doing so is not required by the thought that duties of justice can arise from the social treatment of genetic disabilities/disadvantages, that structural discrimination and disadvantage are serious issues, nor from the thought that we have important moral duties other than justice that are owed to those who suffer genetic bad luck.

For example, one can be moved by Rawls' argument that no-one deserves their place in either the natural or the social lottery without supposing that one's place in the former is unjust. Indeed, if Wolff is right, including the disabled (or at least some of them) in discussions of public policy matters to the outcomes we get not because their demands on public policy are that they be able to do all the things/or satisfy all the non-instrumental concerns they would be able to satisfy if they did not have the disabilities they have, but that they not be treated worse than other people, that the world should not be especially unjust to them. (154, emphasis in the text).[1] Wheel-chair friendly environments do not erase the real and significant differences between needing and not needing a wheel-chair. But they do mean that wheel-chair users are not excluded from activities that they would otherwise enjoy, from which they might benefit and to which they have much to contribute, because we wrongly assume that justice for the disabled is primarily about the distribution of special resources, or of 'fixing' those who are disabled, rather than the removal of handicaps created by familiar ways of thinking and behaving. Granted that what is at issue in the case discussed by Wolff are public policies rather than principles of justice, it remains to be seen why, even if we are concerned with the latter, we should understand disadvantages caused solely by differential genetic abilities/disabilities as examples of injustice, especially if one is moved by Lippert-Rasmussen's arguments about 'Tiny Tim' and the bias towards normality in ch. 4.4 pp. 84-87. Does this not risk confusing structural discrimination with bad luck?

If the discussion of the appeal of luck egalitarianism is one of the book’s weakest elements (along with the discussion of alternative perspectives in ch. 7), Lippert-Rasmussen's discussion of the metric of equality is one of its strongest features, and will be appreciated by most readers whatever their ultimate conclusions about luck egalitarianism. I would, however, like to register two doubts about the argument he develops. The first concerns the alleged 'fetishism' of treating resources, rather than welfare, as the appropriate metric for measuring equality; and the second concerns the justification for supposing that our instrumental interests in the good things in life are a less good guide to what equality requires than our non-instrumental interests. The two concerns are, obviously, connected in so far as resourcist approaches to equality are typically motivated by the fact that there are different ways of achieving the same ends, and people may -- for complicated reasons -- differ in the means they use to secure their ends, as well as in the ends they seek. The advantages of a resourcist approach to equality, such as Rawls', is that if it works, we do not need to know whether people value the basic liberties for their own sake or merely instrumentally; nor need we know this as regards opportunities and the rest of the primary goods -- income and wealth and the social bases of self-respect. This has informational advantages, as compared to Amartya Sen's capabilities approach, as Joshua Cohen has noted, but it clearly has informational advantages compared to most welfarist approaches too.[2] With those informational advantages go advantages in the protection of privacy. However, if resourcist approaches to equality are irretrievably fetishistic, we would have reason to abandon them. But are they?

Lippert-Rasmussen appears to endorse the claim that they are (99, 109), but the only real argument we are given for supposing that it is a mistake to focus on resources rather than welfare is that, given different metabolic rates, and different physical needs/capacities, people will get different levels of advantage/wellbeing from the same amount of resources. However, within a certain range of differences, this is unlikely to be a problem -- men need to eat more than women who are not pregnant, but provided that equality of food resources covers that range, there is no particular disadvantage to men. Outside that range, those who argue for equality of resources will, presumably, allow that there are justified grounds for supplementing the resource shares of those who would otherwise be unfairly treated. Quite likely there are difficulties specifying the resourcist view properly, just as adequate specification of the alternatives requires discussion of real and hypothetical preferences, or informed as opposed to uninformed concerns (100).  However, what is unclear is why we must fetishise resources, in order to suppose them a better test of equality than wellbeing and its alternatives. Indeed, taking Rawls' primary goods as an example of a resourcist view, it seems that resourcist tests for equality can be motivated by the difficulty of determining what is of ultimate value to people and the need to protect their equality in the face of changes to their ultimate ends, as well as to their intermediate ones.

That is not to say that resourcist views of equality are better than welfarist ones, or than Lippert-Rasmussen's favoured alternative, but as the charge of fetishism matters whether or not one is a luck egalitarian, substantiating the charge is of obvious philosophical importance. And something similar would be true of Lippert-Rasmussen's assumptions about the insignificance of our instrumental concerns to equality -- a view that shapes his favoured version of luck egalitarianism, but would seem to have broader implications for egalitarian thought. The intuition is fairly clear: we want to treat people as equals in the way that most matters to them -- hence the appeal of welfare/happiness as the metric of equality. And what most matters to them is, ex hypothesi, what they most value non-instrumentally. But this can be so without it following that all non-instrumental concerns are more important morally than all instrumental ones -- there are plenty of things we may value non-instrumentally, after all, which are pretty trivial (ice-cream, say), whereas some instrumental interests (shelter, nutrition, medical care) are hugely important. It is therefore unclear why we should identify the realisation of luck egalitarian goals with the protection of non-instrumental concerns from the adverse effects of bad luck (p. 100). Indeed, it is worth considering whether we are sufficiently sure of our ability to categorise instrumental and non-instrumental concerns regarding the things that most matter to equality (rights, liberties, opportunities, health, safety, nourishment etc.) that it is desirable philosophically to choose a metric of equality that requires us to make clear distinctions between them.

[1] Wolff, Ethics and Public Policy: A Philosophical Inquiry, (Routledge, 2011).

[2] Cohen, review of Sen's Inequality Reexamined, in Journal of Philosophy 92.5. (1995), 275-288.