Luck, Value, and Commitment: Themes From the Ethics of Bernard Williams

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Ulrike Heuer and Gerald Lang (eds.), Luck, Value, and Commitment: Themes From the Ethics of Bernard Williams, Oxford University Press, 2012, 304pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199599325.

Reviewed by L. Nandi Theunissen, Johns Hopkins University


Bernard Williams is in a rare class of philosophers. He has made studies of figures in the history of the tradition; he has drawn on the tradition to articulate proposals in epistemology; he has written widely in ethics. One feels he has impressive range. Like other British analytic philosophers of his generation, he writes with a lively, often humorous, persona. Even when they are somewhat technical, his essays are humanistic and, one might say, worldly. More than the details of his proposals, he will be remembered for his insights, and especially, for his sense for good questions in philosophy. His questions continue to direct and provide terms for discussions in ethics.

The collection bears this out concretelyIt brings together leading figures on several topics for which Williams laid the foundation: ethical theory (Brad Hooker, Phillip Pettit, Susan Wolf); moral luck (David Enoch, Joseph Raz, R. Jay Wallace); reasons (Michael Smith, Heuer, John Broome); moral epistemology (Jonathan Dancy); and equality and discrimination (Lang). Some of these essays engage with Williams directly and at length -- as when Broome discusses an unpublished lecture by Williams on the concept 'ought'; others take up his problems in new ways -- as when Lang turns to questions about speciesism. In what follows, I focus on the contributions on ethical theory and moral luck. Williams's concerns about ethical theory are the center of his work in ethics, and inform much of what he writes on normative and theoretical topics. Moral luck is one of Williams's signature concerns, and the contributions here are among the best in the volume.

Hooker responds to Williams-style objections to ethical theory, and advances a qualified defense against them. We should accept the method of reflective equilibrium, leaving open the possibility that there is no single, foundational moral principle, no method for resolving conflicts between principles, no commensurability, or codifiability. Hooker's main, positive argument is that within everyday ethical thought there is already the pressure to engage in a minimal level of theorizing (p. 29). We make intuitive ethical judgments with varying levels of generality. Since we should check to see if there are inconsistencies among these judgments -- what Hooker seems to envisage as a standing obligation -- we must do some theorizing. One wonders if we have a standing obligation to root out inconsistencies in our intuitive beliefs about non-ethical matters. If so, does this include all of our beliefs -- however trivial? And are we to do this in advance of running up against the world -- in advance of the "red-lights" which prompt deliberation, as Pettit puts it in another connection?[1] But even if we secure an obligation to check for inconsistencies, one feels it is a rather slim gain for ethical theory. For the obligation alone leaves all the substantial questions -- how are the inconsistencies to be resolved?; can they be resolved in advance of judgment about particular cases? -- off the table. This encourages the impression that Hooker makes a case for ethical theory only by remaining agnostic about much that troubled Williams.[2]

Still, there is scope for important disagreement between Hooker and Williams. Hooker defends the view that ethical theory starts with intuitions. These are moral beliefs with, in Hooker's version of self-evidence, "independent credibility": credibility apart from arguments (pp. 22-23).[3] Hooker's examples of intuitions (p. 25) involve thin concepts ('right', 'wrong', and 'permissible'); they concern actions or action types ("No amount of fun obtained from torturing people to death could make doing such a thing ethically permissible"); they include universal moral principles ("Everyone matters morally"). In other words, they are highly theoretically committed. They are the consequence of developments in moral thought which, while they may now be broadly in the culture, at one time needed to be defended and argued for. This raises a difficult question about their status as independently credible. As Williams (1995) reminds us, ethical theorists often neglect the fact that "our ethical ideas consist of a very complex historical deposit" (p. 189). It is in this spirit that Williams has made studies of the origins, role, and significance of various of our concepts: 'equality', 'democracy', 'sincerity', and, of course, 'morality'.

Pettit gives a version of consequentialism that aims to take account of some of the canonical criticisms raised by Williams and others. He outlines an indirect form of consequentialism in the spirit of Peter Railton (1984). With it he makes a panoptic comparison between consequentialism and all other rival theories about morality, non-moral value, and politics. I am doubtful about Pettit's way of dividing up theories into consequentialist and non-consequentialist. For him, the key feature that picks out a theory as non-consequentialist is a commitment to identity-dependence. For non-consequentialist theories, "one is entitled to enjoy a certain non-promotional prerogative even when this means that there is less good realized in the world overall" (p. 54). So non-consequentialist theories permit agents to "treat themselves as special in a certain way, making personal identity relevant to what they prescribe" (p. 54).

Is this true of non-consequentialist theories about morality? For the Kantian, our identity as agents is simply that of practical reasoners (not the identity of me-here-now with a certain history). And the point of the formula of universal law is precisely that we are not to make an exception of ourselves. In what sense is the Kantian committed to identity-dependence? Pettit's argument is intriguing. For Pettit, if I am a Kantian, and I am making a comparison between two worlds, one in which more people are moral and one in which fewer people are, I would choose the world in which more people are moral. But, the argument continues, if that is a world in which I am immoral, I would not choose that world. That is, the Kantian will discriminate between worlds on the basis of how far the satisfaction of the universal constraint is promoted, unless she knows her place (p. 55, n. 13). Now Kant is no stranger to the agent-neutral good. But what of there being more or less of it -- what of promotion? The kind of value that morality has is distinctly different from what Kant calls price value. It cannot be quantified, added together, and compared. So for Kant it does not make sense to say, as Pettit's argument requires, that more of the moral good is better than less. Kant does not set things up this way.

What of Pettit's criterion for non-consequentialism about non-moral value? Take his example of works of art. I am doubtful that we are forced to be consequentialists about art if we think that assessment should not be merely a function of individual taste, but of general interest (p. 60) -- that is, if we deny identity-dependence. We assess a work of art in terms of how enriching it is to us qua human perceivers and judges, and our judgment is good if it is authoritative for others -- if it meets with agreement, or holds up to the standards of conversation about art. Our assessment is not identity-dependent in Pettit's sense, but neither is it consequentialist: we do not think a work is better when it makes for more enrichment -- as if we look to the number of people enriched and the degree of their enrichment in making our assessments. Nor should it be. If we were to become so impoverished that we no longer find enrichment in good work, but only in what grabs our attention or easily entertains, then so much the worse for us (not for art).

Wolf develops Williams's (1976) criticism of the man who considers the moral permissibility of saving his wife over a stranger in a ship that is going down. Against the standard interpretation, Wolf urges that Williams's point cannot be laid to rest merely by observing that thought of the permissibility of saving one's wife need not occur at the moment of action, but only at a cool hour (p. 74). For Williams is inviting us to question the idea, not just that we should be constantly attentive to questions of moral permissibility, but, more deeply, that we should be unconditionally committed to acting within the bounds of morality (p. 75). Wolf takes Williams to suggest that we need not be so committed, and she proposes to defend him.

Wolf invokes Williams's (1985) discussion of "the morality system": a conception of morality that crucially involves: (i) an impartial point of view from which actions are judged permissible, requisite, or forbidden; and (ii) an unconditional commitment to moral requirements (p. 83). Wolf challenges (ii). As she sees it, there are the values of the morality system, and there are other, non-moral values. Moreover our commitment to non-moral values, to our families for example, may be categorical in its own way, for perhaps it sustains our very desire to live (pp. 86-88). Where our commitment to family comes into conflict with morality, we might want to say: morality is not more important than our families! (p. 88). Wolf's question is whether this is a viable stance. In her formulation: "Is it immoral to be willing, in an unspecified range of circumstances, to risk offending against the impartial point of view?" (p. 85). If morality is identified with the impartial point of view, then trivially yes. But I take it Wolf is really asking: is it permissible in some non-moral sense? To that her answer is: (personally) yes, for relationships matter to me.[4]

This leaves us with an unstable, hybrid picture, one that accepts impartial morality as traditionally conceived but limits its influence. Wolf proposes to give up a defining feature of the morality system, namely categorical bindingness. But that ought to make us wonder about the rest. Perhaps offending against the impartial point of view is not immoral because we should not identify morality with the impartial point of view. We should also reject (i). And perhaps there is no philosophically interesting distinction between moral and other kinds of practical consideration, so that Wolf's animating tension between morality and personal commitment is wrongly conceived. A range of further, viable options are well represented in the literature.

The second section of the book opens up new directions on the topic of moral luck. Crediting Wolf with the animating thought,[5] Enoch makes a case for there being a moral duty to take responsibility for an action -- our own, that of our child, that of our country -- though we are not in fact responsible for it. In a slogan, responsibility need not be something we find ourselves with; it may be something we take upon ourselves (p. 103). Enoch's is a careful development of an important, possible position. Wallace uses a famous example from Derek Parfit (1984) to bring out the possibility that an action may be wrong and unjustified, though it is not an appropriate object of regret. The young teenager in Parfit's example should not have made the decision to conceive and give birth to a child, while she now has reason not only not to regret, but more positively, to celebrate, the child's existence. Wallace brings this finding to bear on Williams's discussion of moral luck. Should Williams's Gauguin turn out to be a successful artist, his success may make it inappropriate for him to feel all-in regret for leaving his family in a tenuous situation in Paris, but that does not show that Gauguin was after all justified in leaving his family. This ought to make us question Williams's conclusion that morality is vulnerable to luck (p. 187). For the events following Gauguin's decision do not change the fact that he was not justified in acting as he did.

Raz takes up the significance of agent-regret for theories of responsibility. The phenomenon of agent-regret, and other considerations about negligence, point to an inadequacy in theories of responsibility which turn on control. Raz lays out a theory of responsibility on which we are responsible for conduct that is the result of the functioning, successful or failed, of our powers of rational agency (p. 138). Why should we be thought responsible for malfunctions? Because the kind of responsiveness to the world that is basic to our agency includes, crucially, the development and honing of skills. There are skills that are basic to being a rational agent, with a rational agent's mental faculties, and motor control, and there are skills that depend on an agent's particular set of abilities, dispositions, and degree of training. For each of us there is a domain of competence, a domain in which our powers of rational agency are securely reliable (p. 154). That domain is tied to our conception of our own abilities, our ambitions, aspirations, in short: our sense of who we are. Raz claims that we are responsible for unintentional actions and omissions when they are the result of a failed intentional action that falls within our domain of secure competence (pp. 153-154).

It follows that the truck-driver is justified in feeling agent-regret if the accident bears on his skills as a driver. If it was a freak accident, then his regret does not bear in the right way on him, and it is unjustified. Raz helpfully points to the limitations of Williams's account of the significance of agent-regret. For Williams it is confined to momentous life-changing decisions or events. Raz argues that the phenomenon is much more general and basic. But Raz's account may in the end exclude Williams's paradigm cases: Gauguin and Anna Karenina. On Raz's account, what rationalizes our attachment to the consequences of our actions is that it is by acting in the world that we form a sense of ourselves. As we saw, Raz's account gives central place to skill: we learn to manipulate our environment, we test our limits and hone our capabilities. When Williams talks about whether Gauguin was justified in deliberating as he did, he has fun with the idea that Gauguin might have conclusive epistemic grounds on which to deliberate about becoming a great artist. The thought, I take it, is that becoming a great artist is not something, in Raz's terms, one may be skilled at. What would it mean to be skilled at becoming a great artist? (We may ask the question, mutatis mutandis, of Anna Karenina). In Raz's terms, these exceptional and dramatic cases are not cases in which we are attached in the right way with the world. And yet they seem to be compelling cases of the phenomenon Williams introduced. If that is right, then what Raz proposed to make out as merely special cases of a more general phenomenon, turn out to be excluded by the phenomenon as Raz characterizes it.

Perhaps Raz will want to say that Williams's paradigm cases are on the risky-gamble side of the spectrum of actions, so that regret is unjustified (on risks and gambles see p. 145; on mixed cases see p. 146). On the other hand, perhaps Raz will say that there are skills at issue in the two cases: knowing how to bring considerations to bear on life-changing decisions; knowing how to moderate strong compulsions and emotions (in Anna's case); knowing one's limits and capabilities in general. That is, Raz might insist that there are relevant general skills and capabilities at issue, though perhaps the idea of a 'domain', which bespeaks something separately identifiable and discrete, is less natural.

Though I cannot discuss them in detail here, I direct the reader to Heuer's and Dancy's contributions. Both adjudicate important debates. Dancy adjudicates between Williams and John McDowell on the analogy between value and secondary qualities. With Williams, Dancy rejects the analogy. To see colors we need only open our eyes. Not so with values. Here we may need things explained to us, we may need to be inculcated. With McDowell, Dancy defends the possibility of objectivity in the domain of value, and rejects Williams's considerations about divergent value practices. Against Williams, Dancy urges that it is perfectly possible for there to be incompatible values, for example, the values of tolerance and commitment. For Dancy we simply live with this essential tension (p. 285). Heuer adjudicates between Williams and Simon Blackburn on thick concepts. Blackburn challenged the idea that thick concepts support a realist account of practical reason, on grounds that many judgments involving thick concepts license behaviors we should reject (pp. 220-221). Williams's reply turns on his view that ethical knowledge is confined to a community: only members of the community have the relevant reasons to behave (p. 222). This is because only they have the relevant motivational orientation. Heuer considers whether Williams's view of thick concepts is after all compatible with his account of reasons internalism, and concludes that it is not. Though both are critical of Williams's positions, Heuer's and Dancy's contributions are worthy homages to an enduring figure.[6]


Hooker, Brad. (2002). "Intuitions and Moral Theorizing", in Stratton-Lake (ed.) Ethical Intuitionism, Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 161-183.

Parfit, Derek. (1984). Reasons and Persons, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.

Railton, Peter. (1984). "Alienation, Consequentialism and the Demands of Morality", in Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 13, No. 2, pp. 134-171.

Williams, Bernard. (1976). "Persons Character and Morality", in Amelie Oksenberg Rorty Identities of Persons, Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press, pp. 197-216.

Williams, Bernard. (1985). Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.

Williams, Bernard. (1995). "What Does Intuitionism Imply?", in Making Sense of Humanity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 182-191.

Wolf, Susan. (2000). "The Moral of Moral Luck", Philosophical Exchange 31, pp. 4-19.

[1] See also Wolf (p. 81 and ff.).

[2] In his (1995) "What Does Intuitionism Imply?", an essay that bears on Hooker's paper, and is taken up by Dancy, Williams explicitly contrasts reflective equilibrium with moral theory, accepting the one and rejecting the other (p. 188 and ff.).

[3] His discussion here draws from (Hooker, 2002).

[4] Wolf here takes up the subjectivist strands in Williams's work. For discussion of Williams's subjectivism, see the "Appendix" to Raz.

[5] See (Wolf, 2000).

[6] For helpful feedback and discussion, I would like to thank Katja Vogt, Andreja Novakovic, Jed Lewinsohn, and Nemira Gasiunas.