Ludwig Wittgenstein on Race, Gender and Cultural Identity

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Béla Szabados, Ludwig Wittgenstein on Race, Gender and Cultural Identity, Edwin Mellen, 2010, 275pp., $109.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780773438170.

Reviewed by Laurence Goldstein, University of Kent



Some who have written on the philosophy of Wittgenstein, including Ray Monk, Georg Henrik von Wright and the present author, have sensed that, in some way, difficult to describe, knowledge of the man’s life, and of the peculiarities of his character, will contribute to an understanding of his philosophical views. I think it fair to say that, to date, this way of attempting to throw light on the subject has achieved little illumination. Béla Szabados seeks to do better. He holds that biographical or socio-cultural information can help settle disputes about the interpretation of an author’s philosophical writings (p. 60). This, Szabados thinks, is likely to be especially true of Wittgenstein who held that ‘work on philosophy … is really more a work on oneself’. Szabados believes that ’Wittgenstein’s literary executors may have made a mistake in their attempts to separate Wittgenstein’s personal remarks from those traditionally accepted as philosophical… . Such a separation is likely to blind us to the philosophical aspects of the personal and the personal aspects of the philosophical’. Szabados accordingly devotes a lot of time to exploring Wittgenstein’s notebooks and private diaries. He claims that ‘philosophy is essentially a personal endeavour in truth and in Wittgenstein, there is no facet of Wittgenstein’s personality which can be said in advance to be irrelevant to an understanding of his philosophy’ (p. 2).

It is odd that Szabados tells us what essentially philosophy is, when, two pages later, he is execrating the ‘cravings for unity, for essence’. And what, anyway, is ‘a personal endeavour in truth’? Szabados’ text, particularly the first half, is littered with pretentious phrases, dubious grammar and tenuous sense. ‘When you look into the mirror of a philosopher, eventually you have got to be able to see yourself too. And to do this, you need to give something of yourself’ (p. 15). ‘A philosopher also deconstructs himself as he philosophizes’ (p. 17). However, Szabados frequently writes well, and the book does offer a novel account of the relationship between Wittgenstein’s life and work. This reviewer felt obliged, under Szabados’ guiding hand, to re-evaluate some of his own long-standing negative views about Wittgenstein’s character.

What critics find repugnant about Wittgenstein’s diary notes is that they seem unhealthily self-absorbed and contain remarks about science, about people speaking against the production of the atomic bomb and particularly about women and about Jews, that seem stupid and offensive and not at all worthy of a great thinker. As is well known, Wittgenstein castigated Norman Malcolm for using the phrase ‘the British national character’; Wittgenstein thought such phrases dangerous and their use as betraying a certain ‘primitiveness’. Yet he himself talks of the ‘unpoetic mentality’ of the Semitic races, says that only Jews will be attracted to masked theatre, that even the greatest Jewish thinker is no more than talented, and so on. Significantly, though, these remarks about Jews were written in 1930-1, the castigation of Malcolm in 1939. It is part of Szabados’ case that Wittgenstein’s views matured quite considerably over time; that the self-therapy he administered through his work on philosophy achieved positive results.

There is considerable evidence that Wittgenstein had a low opinion of women in general. He was opposed to giving them the vote and even, on social occasions, ignored women guests. Szabados has an interesting angle on this: ’Wittgenstein’s misogynistic attitudes are in line with the greater part of the philosophical tradition of the West and cannot be explained merely in terms of his personal idiosyncrasies’ (p. 63). Szabados cites some disappointing remarks of Aristotle, Aquinas, Schopenhauer and Nietzsche. Yet Wittgenstein did rather better than these distinguished predecessors because although, early on, he fell under the evil influence of Otto Weininger, he subsequently, according to Szabados, prised himself free, acquired a better attitude and ended up repudiating Weininger’s Sex and Character, assessing it as a great work but wholly mistaken. As Szabados admits, it does somewhat put a crimp in his thesis that, as late as 1947, Wittgenstein remarked to Elizabeth Anscombe (presumably an honorary man) ‘Thank God we have got rid of the women!’ on realising that there were no female students left in the class. Szabados speculates that this was a lapse, an act of recidivism, or a joke, ‘an example of Wittgenstein’s humor which tended to take the paradoxical or the incongruous as its object’ (p. 73).

Given his interest in such questions and that he has been writing on Wittgenstein and his life for around 30 years, it is amazing that Szabados never seems to have availed himself of the opportunity to talk to people who knew Wittgenstein and to find out from them how he behaved around women. Instead, he confines his attention to the rather thin textual evidence available to us. He suggests that, when he talks of ‘pictures that hold us captive’, one of the pictures to which Wittgenstein is alluding is the stereotypes of those groups, including women, that constitute ‘the other’. So, consistent with his penchant for the particular, his resistance to the craving for generality and his rejection of essences, the late Wittgenstein, as Szabados tells it, is helping us to abandon stereotypes and the associated prejudice against women. Wittgenstein elsewhere compares himself to a particularly fertile soil for other people’s ideas. Szabados thinks that, in calling these ideas ‘seeds’, Wittgenstein is employing a ‘feminine metaphor’ and comments that, ‘Here Wittgenstein describes himself in terms of erotic, feminine imagery which resonates with themes of impregnation and fecundity’ (p. 85). Penetrating insight or silly speculation?

Some of Wittgenstein’s pre-1931 remarks about Jews jar so chillingly because they seem bitterly racist. But Szabados forces us to look more closely at those passages. Mostly they depict the Jewish sensibility not as inferior, but just as different — a view also held by Ernest Renan, whom Wittgenstein had read. Wittgenstein may occasionally have been somewhat self-deprecating and doubtful of his own originality, but he lists some Jews among the truly original thinkers who influenced him. According to Wittgenstein, ‘The Jew is a desert region under whose thin layer of rock lies the molten lava of spirit and intellect’. It’s not quite clear what this means, but it doesn’t sound all bad, and the same is true of ‘It is typical of the Jewish mind to understand someone else’s work better than he understands it himself’. Szabados says ‘For Wittgenstein, there is a variety of thinking styles and cultural sensibilities. In his remarks, Wittgenstein is trying to describe the characteristic features of a distinctive Jewish style and sensibility’ (pp. 106-7). Perhaps to some relativists or adherents of the Sapir-Whorf hypothesis, this will seem entirely reasonable, but I doubt whether many Jewish thinkers would identify with, or even make much sense of, Wittgenstein’s claim that his thoughts are ‘100% Hebraic’.

In Szabados’ view (and this is one of those junctures where the biographical and the philosophical coalesce) Wittgenstein’s later detaching himself from the ‘grammatical illusion’ of the prototype Jew or the British character coincides with it dawning upon him that the correct use of a common noun depends not upon all the objects to which it applies sharing a single feature, but upon a variety of similarities between subsets of them that could helpfully be termed ‘family resemblances’. Szabados locates ‘big and important discontinuities between the early and later Wittgenstein’ especially in the realm of ethics, and succeeds as exposing as nonsensical the ‘New Wittgensteinian’ view that the Tractatus is devoid of theory and is all nonsense (pp. 180-7). Wiitgenstein’s later style is, as Szabados nicely puts it ‘look and see’; describe, and resist the temptation to theorize and to generalize.

Wittgenstein came from a musically sophisticated family and was, by all accounts, an intense listener. Many of his remarks on music, both in Philosophical Investigations and in his diary are highly perceptive and repay close attention. But on various occasions, he expresses a dislike verging on hatred for works of Mendelssohn and, particularly, of Mahler, and it is easy to interpret this as another manifestation of crude anti-Semitism. Szabados goes a long way towards invalidating this reading and showing that Wittgenstein was onto something important. Suffice to say that if (like me) you enjoy the music of Mahler, Szabados’ sympathetic account of Wittgenstein’s antipathy to the composer may leave you feeling a little ashamed:

those sweet Ländler melodies invite an undiscerning celebration of folkishness and the nature of the peasant. The open horn chords invite a dream of freedom; those distant trumpets hold forth a prospect of redemption and transcendence, of eventually triumph and victory; the faux-naïf effects suggest a false innocence, sentimentality, and nostalgia (p. 155).

Szabados argues, with some plausibility, that Wittgenstein was so down on Mahler because he detected in him many of the poor character traits that Wittgenstein despised in himself.

There has been much debate about Wittgenstein’s views on ethics since, as Szabados points out, the evidence is rife with contradiction. In the Tractatus, Wittgenstein says that it is clear that ethics cannot be put into words, that it is impossible for there to be propositions of ethics. Szabados holds that Wittgenstein subscribes to many of the views defended by G.E. Moore in Principia Ethica. It is hard to see how this can be right, given that to state and defend a view one must put it into words. Consistently with his principles, Wittgenstein does not do moral philosophy in the Tractatus. In 1930, soon after returning to Cambridge, he gave a popular ‘Lecture on Ethics’ and his views on the subject changed when he entered the late stage of his career. Ordinary discourse is replete with ‘thick’ ethical vocabulary and Wittgenstein in his late period recognized the important role of such discourse in our multifarious activities. What he opposed was moral theorizing for, as Szabados points out, such theorizing ‘is bound to result in harmful oversimplification’ (p. 191). ‘Instead of an engagement with normative or meta-ethical theorizing, there is [in Wittgenstein’s late period] a focus on reliable appraisals in particular situations, with a particular purpose’ (p. 203) and Wittgenstein encourages us to ruminate on the problematic situations that arise in real life or in imaginative literature. In this anti-theorizing attitude to morality and moral self-improvement, Wittgenstein is a precursor of philosophers such as Bernard Williams, Colin McGinn and Tim Chappell. He seems to have thought that, in his own case, room for improvement was particularly sizeable in the area of self-deception.

‘What is good is also divine. Queer as it sounds, that sums up my ethics.’ Queer indeed. Wittgenstein claimed that, though not a religious man, he could not help seeing every problem from a religious point of view. Yet, in a coded diary of 1937, we find him calling upon the Almighty: ‘May God have mercy on me … God, let me be pious but not eccentric! Believe that at any moment God can demand everything from you! Be truly aware of this!’. Strange things for a non-religious man to say. The book is rounded off with an essay by Szabados on Kai Nielsen’s discussion, in his book Naturalism and Religion, of Wittgenstein and his relation to religion.

Szabados battles with a number of authors, usually with satisfying results, but it is sadly to his discredit that he, like many of Wittgenstein’s admirers, entirely disregards Kimberly Cornish’s controversial book The Jew of Linz. Cornish provides not yet conclusive evidence that in 1904 Wittgenstein overlapped with Hitler at the Realschule in Linz and came to believe that Hitler’s subsequent hatred of Jews and the terrible consequences that ensued was sparked by the precocious, petulant, vain, arrogant, untrustworthy schoolboy Wittgenstein. If, later in life, Wittgenstein were burdened by a great guilt, needed to reflect obsessively on his sins and to work on courageously scrutinizing and correcting the nasty aspects of his character, that would go some way to explaining some of the odd behavior and curious remarks that Szabados is at pains to interpret.

This is a provocative book that deserved better editing.