Ludwig Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations: An Attempt at a Critical Rationalist Appraisal

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Joseph Agassi, Ludwig Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations: An Attempt at a Critical Rationalist Appraisal, Springer, 2018, 295pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783030001162.

Reviewed by Brendan Shea, Rochester Community and Technical College


The acrimony between Karl Popper and Ludwig Wittgenstein has become the stuff of philosophical legend (Edmonds and Eidinow 2002). In the mid-20th century, they offered sharply divergent ideas about the best path for philosophy going forward. While Popper remains a mainstay in introductory courses in the philosophy of science, his "critical rationalist" approach to philosophy has remained marginal with analytic philosophy, especially when compared to the overwhelming influence of Wittgenstein. To what extent does this difference in perceived stature track genuine differences in philosophical contributions? In this book, one of Popper's most eminent students, Joseph Agassi, attempts to provide an answer. He argues that Wittgenstein's contributions are much more modest than is sometimes claimed and that his influence on subsequent analytic philosophy has not always been benign. Agassi provides a unique and welcome perspective on these issues, and there's much of interest in the book, even though Agassi's interpretation of Wittgenstein may not convince those not already sympathetic to his point of view.

While the title of Agassi's book suggests that his main focus is the Philosophical Investigations, this is somewhat misleading, as only three of the book's 13 chapters focus on it. By contrast, Agassi devotes seven chapters to background on Wittgenstein, and one chapter each to Wittgenstein's early and middle periods. He closes the book with a chapter reflecting on Wittgenstein's influence. The preface notes that the book is based on lecture notes from a 1992 class. This might help to explain its general format and approach, with Agassi covering a huge amount of ground in the history of analytic philosophy, but offering little in terms of detailed, line-by-line interpretations of disputed passages by Wittgenstein or critical engagements with secondary literature. While this approach works well enough in the first half, it hampers Agassi's efforts in the second half, as he doesn't provide detailed arguments for many of his more provocative interpretive claims regarding Wittgenstein.

Agassi's early remarks in Chapter 1 set the tone for the rest of the book. He begins by stating that contemporary analytic philosophy can be best characterized by its "hostility . . . to poetry" and that it suffers from a "cult of personality" centered on Wittgenstein (1). He identifies Wittgenstein's only message as being that "all metaphysical expressions are hopelessly ungrammatical", which leaves Wittgenstein with apparently "no major role" in a rational reconstruction of the history of philosophy (2). It is against this unpromising backdrop that Agassi sets out to see what a critical rationalist might learn from Wittgenstein's work and his heritage. He goes on to sketch some major themes, including the centrality of Wittgenstein's anti-metaphysics, his debt to Russell, and his influence within subsequent analytic philosophy. He closes the chapter close to where he began, however, by approving of Russell's opinion that Wittgenstein's early philosophy was "significant (although erroneous)" and his later philosophy "too trite to deserve notice", though he promises to "ameliorate" this opinion if he can (25).

Agassi spends chapters 2 through 5 surveying historical antecedents to Wittgenstein's anti-metaphysics. Among these, Agassi includes Francis Bacon's "Doctrine of Prejudice," according to which one should avoid advancing hypotheses of any type before making observations, to avoid prejudicing the observations. Agassi argues that Wittgenstein's radical anti-metaphysics went well beyond that of Bacon, in large part because his background in modern, post-Boolean logic allowed him to reject the "essentialism," and the referential theory of naming, that Agassi argues is implicit in classical, Aristotelian logic. This argument, in turn, leads Agassi to a detailed discussion of the philosophical import of Boole's "liberation of logic from obligatory essentialism" (62), and the ways this helped set the stage for both Frege's logic and for the "analysis new-style" (of statements as opposed to terms) that characterizes early analytic philosophy. Agassi describes how this led to a shift "from the view of logic as the logic of science -- of proven informative truths -- to the view of logic as the logic of formal languages -- of correct speech, of following grammar" (91) by the early twentieth century.

Agassi agrees with the early analytic philosophers' rejection of essential definitions. However, he wants to "salvage as much of metaphysics as possible" (45) by reinterpreting metaphysical hypotheses as speculations or conjectures. In keeping with this view, he raises numerous objections to Wittgenstein's anti-metaphysical views, many of which recur in different forms throughout the book. So, for example, he argues that anti-metaphysical views can't account for the importance that certain metaphysical views, such as ancient atomism, have played in the development of modern scientific theories (20). He also notes that Wittgenstein's project seems to assume that metaphysics is disturbing, but that many people, including scientists like Maxwell and Einstein, enjoy it (28). He even presents a brief argument against William's "Knowledge and Meaning in the Philosophy of Mind" (1968), which he describes as a "towering paper" of analytic philosophy that (purportedly) "proved metaphysics is impossible" (37). He goes on to offer the failure of William's argument as evidence of the "declining standards" of analytic philosophy, for which Wittgenstein is at least partially responsible (38-39). More generally, Agassi suggests that the shift to the logic of language that characterizes analytic philosophy left science "in a lurch", and approvingly notes that Popper "alone" resisted this shift to stay within "the logic of science" (97).

Chapters 6 and 7 discuss Frege and Russell, respectively, and Agassi provides a worthwhile discussion of how their formal work in logic and mathematics relates to their ideas about language and meaning. He discusses the way in which Frege's project of attempting to show arithmetic was analytic was itself motivated by Kantian arguments against this analyticity, and in Boolean innovations that (by widening the concept of logical truth) seemed to offer a possible response. This project, in turn, provides the context necessary both for understanding the details of Frege's functional calculus and for his theory of meaning, and for Russell's responses to them. Agassi identifies Russell as the first philosopher to do analysis new-style and describes his initial aims as: "to render philosophy scientific and to prove that science is certain (since tradition equates reason with provability)" (127). Agassi suggests that Russell bequeathed his view of philosophy as analysis to Wittgenstein, who continued it long after his mentor abandoned it.

In chapters 8 and 9, Agassi finally turns to Wittgenstein's ideas during the Tractarian and "interim" periods, though these chapters build on remarks he'd made earlier. He states that the Tractatus is "not difficult to comprehend," and any difficulties are primarily due to Wittgenstein's "brevity and the refusal to ascribe to him false ideas" (106). With this in mind, Agassi spends little time attempting to resolve ambiguous passages in the Tractatus or engage with rival interpretations. He claims that young Wittgenstein adopted a version of methodological "neutral monism" according to which "every atomic proposition is a multiple of space-time coordinates and of the diverse possible sensations with decisions of the degree or the yes-and-no kind" (156). Agassi sees Wittgenstein's philosophy of this period as following strictly in Russell's footsteps and describes Russell's criticisms of the project in his Introduction to the Tractatus as being a "tremendous blow" to Wittgenstein (157). Agassi contends that the "root" of Wittgenstein's eventual transition away from this approach during his interim period was his recognition that these doctrines couldn't cope with the problem of induction (166-167).

Agassi devotes chapters 10 through 12 to Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations, a text he says "raises no problems and dismisses all philosophical ones" (191). As was the case with the young Wittgenstein, Agassi presents the mature Wittgenstein as being almost monomaniacally focused on the elimination of metaphysics, though now in the context of ordinary language. He sees Wittgenstein as holding to his early view that metaphysical statements are meaningless in the straightforward sense of lacking a truth value, and that this lack can be determined by examining their use (28-29). The famous Wittgensteinian slogan that "meaning is use" turns out to be an outdated, empirical thesis about language acquisition, as opposed to a substantive idea about the nature of meaning (192-193). Agassi describes mature Wittgenstein as lacking any general, coherent account of what makes a sentence grammatical or meaningful, and of simply declaring metaphysical "what looked to him too metaphysical" (208-209). He concludes that Wittgenstein's failure to offer a general theory of meaning entails that his effort to show all metaphysical statements meaningless is "self-refuting" (222).

On Agassi's account, many widely-commented-on aspects of Wittgenstein's thought turn out to be of little philosophical interest. So, for example, Wittgenstein's ideas about rule-following amount to no more than the claim that one should "follow the rules of language" and "not deviate from the straight and narrow" in order to avoid becoming entangled in metaphysics (193). The no-private language argument, in turn, is Wittgenstein's adaption of a straightforward Russellian argument regarding ideal language, which has no evident relevance to the problem of other minds (202-203). Finally, where Agassi addresses Wittgenstein's specific assertions about grammar -- such as his claim that "I know what I am thinking" is incorrect -- Agassi quickly concludes that they are false. After all, he argues, "substitutions between first and second person singular is always grammatically permissible," and we can imagine contexts in which we would use such a sentence (233).

In chapter 13, Agassi concludes with some overarching thoughts on Wittgenstein's place in the history of philosophy. He begins by arguing that there must be "reasonable standards" (245) for elevating certain figures to being worthy of continued study and that we should "not waste too much time on worthless texts" (246). While Agassi avoids saying so directly, the clear suggestion is that much of Wittgenstein's mature work falls in this category. He does state that "neither Wittgenstein nor analytic philosophy in general offers much by the way of improving philosophy or the philosophy of life," and mentions for a second time the "allegation" that "the attraction of Wittgenstein's philosophy is his having turned a blind eye to both Auschwitz and Hiroshima" (248).

Agassi sees few prospects for defending Wittgenstein's reputation as a "serious thinker" if his anti-metaphysical project is ignored, arguing that neither Wittgenstein's own work nor that of any of his later commentators provide any basis for this (238). He closes with a discussion of the impact of Wittgenstein's methods and ideas on later analytic philosophy (he argues that they are often conflated with those of Moore), and with a consideration of the way Wittgenstein's search for certainty compares with Popper's very different conception of rationality. In perhaps the most succinct summary of his overall interpretation of Wittgenstein, Agassi writes:

Wittgenstein . . . said about it [rationality] one and only one thesis: the understanding is limited to the limits of language. This he argued in his early work, yet the argument holds only within his artificial language that is too limited, as he later admitted. He then asserted that language is limited so that it has no room for metaphysics. He illustrated it; he said, observing language in use will exhibit no metaphysics and no philosophical problems as these "arise when language idles." This is hardly an explanation, much less a proof. The strongest rebuttal of it is the claim (Einstein's) that science can scarcely progress without metaphysics. (265)

In the end, perhaps unsurprisingly, Agassi's "critical rationalist" view of mature Wittgenstein is roughly consonant with those of Russell and Popper, who saw little of philosophical substance with which to engage. Agassi's contribution, then, is to articulate this often-overlooked perspective in much more detail than has been done before. And while the book's reluctance to engage substantively with rival interpretations may limit its impact on those more sympathetic to Wittgenstein, it nevertheless provides a welcome contribution to our understanding of not only Wittgenstein's work, but of the history of analytic philosophy more generally.


Edmonds, David, and John Eidinow. 2002. Wittgenstein's Poker: The Story of a Ten-Minute Argument Between Two Great Philosophers. Reprint edition. New York: Harper Perennial.

Williams, Bernard. 1968. "Knowledge and Meaning in the Philosophy of Mind." The Philosophical Review 77 (2): 216-28.