Lying and Christian Ethics

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Christopher O. Tollefsen, Lying and Christian Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 209pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107061095.

Reviewed by Kevin Jung, Wake Forest University


Those who missed the intense and prolonged debate in Christian ethics concerning the nature of moral norms from the 1960s through the early 1990s now have a fresh opportunity to be acquainted with it, thanks Christopher Tollefsen's new book. Although it is squarely focused on the morality of lying, it is principally about moral norms -- or, to be exact, absolute moral norms. The reader will notice that the tone and style of Tollefsen's argument is remarkably similar, if not identical, to those of the new natural theorists such as Germain Grisez and John Finnis, who strongly defended the idea of exceptionless moral norms in recent decades. In fact, one may easily mistake this book for Finnis's Moral Absolutes or Fundamentals of Ethics.

Tollefsen's main thesis is rather simple: "lying is always and everywhere morally wrong" (5). He calls this the "absolute view" about lying. In order to show that this is the right way to think about lying, he advances his argument in two ways. First, he wants to show that his "absolute view" stands in continuity with the traditional Christianity of the West, especially the Roman Catholic tradition. To do so, he draws primarily from the work of Augustine and Aquinas in Chapter 2 and of John Paul II in Chapter 4 as some of the authoritative Christian figures who believed in moral absolutes, i.e., exceptionless moral norms. Second, Tollefsen believes that the absolute view on lying was "a truth of the natural law, as well as a truth of revealed faith" (5).

Tollefsen calls his view absolute because it does not allow any exceptions to any moral norm involving basic human goods. In arguing that it is always morally wrong to lie, he rejects any attempts to qualify the definition of lying that would make certain forms of lying morally permissible or justifiable. So what is exactly lying? Tollefsen defines it as "intentionally asserting contrary to one's mind" and takes this kind of assertion to be "both necessary and sufficient for something to be a lie" (14). To say that lying must involve an assertion is to distinguish those acts of speech that are propositional (where the speaker affirms that P as a result of judging that P) and other acts of speech that are merely communicative without having any propositional content. Thus, in making an assertion, the speaker takes P to be true, whereas some other forms of communication may contain what is factually true or false. Using Aquinas's distinction between saying something materially false and saying something formally false, Tollefsen states that one speaks formally falsely when it is his or her intention to assert falsely as opposed to what one says is in fact false. Only speaking of what is formally false is considered as lying. Thus various speech acts such as literary or theatrical performance do not constitute lying, even if those speeches say something (materially) false.

It bears mentioning that Tollefsen's definition of lying does not require any specification as to when the intention to deceive becomes a deceptive act. If one asserts something contrary to one's own belief, in his view, there is already an intention to deceive the audience. This is because, in communicating one's judgment that P, one already "intends her audience to take her as communicating both P and her judgment that P" (23). If one affirms that P when she does not believe that P, "there is a kind of deception built into the fabric of the lie that cannot be avoided if the act is to be genuinely communicative" (23).

But is lying as defined above always morally wrong? Can there be certain lies that are morally permissible? This is where Tollefsen's argument gets more interesting. His short answer is an emphatic 'No.' He denies the view that a false assertion is not really a lie or is morally permissible when communicated to one with no right to the truth. Throughout the book, he mentions the case of Nazis who searched for Jews at the door. While Nazis did not have any right to the truth about the whereabouts of the hiding Jews, he insists that a false assertion to anyone, including the horrible Nazis, is still a lie and thus intrinsically evil. In other words, the absolute prohibition on lying holds no matter what one's intention for deception is. Any act of lying is always and intrinsically evil.

But this is not to say that Tollefsen believes that all forms of deceptive communication are intrinsically evil. In Chapter 7, he is at pains to drive a wedge between lying and other deceptive maneuvers such as silence, evasion, and equivocation. On the one hand, he strongly denies a structural analogy between killing and lying, a move that some may use to justify certain forms of lying within the framework of the doctrine of double effect. He explains that "Unlike 'killing,' which can describe behavior as causally, but not intentionally, related to a person's death, 'lying' can only describe intentional actions, for an assertion is not something that can be done accidentally, or voluntarily but outside the intention of the speaker" (150). Unlike physical force involved in unintentional killing that does not "put one into an intended negative relationship to a basic good," "false assertion always puts one into such an intended negative relationship with the goods of integrity and sociality" (150).

On the other hand, Tollefsen believes that other deceptive practices can be morally permissible. One may use, for instance, silence, evasion, selective truth-telling, or equivocation to deceive the hearer, especially when the hearer does not have the right to truth. For instance, by selectively choosing facts, one may hope or expect the hearer to infer a false proposition from a true one, or by choosing a true sentence that has an equivocal (alternate) meaning, one may succeed in protecting oneself from possible repercussions that could otherwise get one into trouble. On this account, an assertion that "These are all my children" need not be a lie if the housewife speaking to a Nazi officer used "family" in the broader sense of the term that includes the restricted meaning. Interestingly, Tollefsen judges the intention to deceive in such a practice to be morally permissible. This is because it still meets the necessary and sufficient condition of lying that he initially set up: it is not a false assertion.

One may wonder why Tollefsen insists that lying as false assertion is always and intrinsically evil. Why such a hard stance on lying? At the heart of his opposition to lying is his claim that lying violates some of the basic human goods that are aspects of human well-being. According to Tollefsen, basic human goods are: "human life and health, knowledge, aesthetic experience, work and play, friendship, marriage, personal integrity and the good of religion, a form of harmony between persons and whatever greater than human source of meaning there might be" (82). This list is almost identical to that of other new natural law theorists such as Finnis. These basic goods are considered irreducible to and incommensurable with each other in that they are believed to be "the essential constituents of a flourishing human life" (82). In addition, "each basic good gives to human agents a basic reason for action, rooted in those aspects of human well-being and perfection promised by instances of those goods" (82).

Perhaps a more controversial claim concerning these basic human goods has been that "one should be always and entirely open to the goods, in all persons, and never act directly or intentionally against any of the goods in any person" (82) This means that, when faced with competing options in the pursuit of goods, one must always refrain from intentionally damaging or harming instances of basic human goods. But, how should we determine whether an act causes "intentional harm"? Explaining John Paul II's views on moral absolutes, Tollefsen argues that, "between the object of an act, its end, and its circumstances, including its consequences, [the] Pope identifies the object of the act as the definitive source of an action's morality as regards moral absolutes" (86). He then maintains that the morality of lying is solely determined by whether or not the rationally chosen object causes damage to instances of basic human goods.

The upshot of this claim is that if one chooses an object as a means to some further end and if it violates any instances of basic human goods, it is always and intrinsically evil because "it can never be ordered to the good of the human person, including the ultimate good of divine-human fellowship" (87). In this respect, the problem with lying is that it "always violates the goods of integrity and sociality, and that it is incompatible also with the goods of truth and of religion, that is, the good of a sound relationship with God" (9). Now, granted that Tollefsen is right about all this, it raises the question  of why lying as false assertion always violates these goods but other deceptive forms of communications mentioned above cannot ever violate them. Certainly, selective truth-telling as we often see in some political ads or TV commercials, for instance, can be intentionally used to mislead people, causing irreparable harm to the goods of integrity and sociality.

One major shortcoming of this book is not so much its defense of moral absolutes but its complete disregard for the dissenting voices in Catholic moral theology or Protestant ethics. Tollefsen does not engage with a single moral theologian who debated with or criticized new natural law theorists. This is rather odd, given the fact that many, if not a great majority of, Catholic moral theologians in the last half century have consistently challenged the particular interpretation of natural law proposed by the new natural law theorists. While he treats the views of Finnis, Grisez, and Joseph Boyle, among others, with such deference and weight, there is not a single reference, let alone equal attention, to thinkers such as Peter Knauer, Louis Janssens, Josef Fuchs, Ralph McInerny, Richard McCormick, and James Gustafson. Even where he briefly discusses proportionalism, he does so only from the perspective of the new natural theory without even providing proportionalists' own accounts. It is not clear whether this neglect is a sign of extreme confidence on his part or because he was not actually trained in the field of moral theology.

Part of the debate on moral absolutes concerns whether the moral evaluation of an act can sometimes be exhaustively determined by a single criterion, viz., the object of the act (finis operis) here narrowly defined as the choice of the will toward intelligible, basic human goods. Tollefsen's premise is that when this choice is believed to involve damage or harm to instances of basic human goods, it is sufficient for determining the morality of the act without considering the totality of the act that involves considering the end of the agent (finis operantis) and its circumstances in addition to the object of the act (finis operis). What this means is that, in a case like lying, the act of false assertion is so intrinsically evil (because it harms some instances of human goods) that "without reference to either the end, the circumstances, or the consequences, we can on occasion know that a human action is wrong if it is an act of the kind identified by the moral absolute in question" (87).

There are numerous issues with this kind of an interpretation of natural law. Let me introduce just two. First, contrary to Tollefsen's claim, many moral theologians have consistently denied that Aquinas held the absolutist position on moral norms. For instance, see Jean Porter's latest book Nature as Reason, in which she sharply criticizes the new natural theorists' interpretation. Second, granted that we human beings can apprehend basic human goods through rational reflection on experience, it does not follow that these goods constitute absolute moral norms that are inviolable and incommensurable. From the fact that there are objects of intrinsic value, it does not follow that these objects should never be damaged under any circumstances or can never be measured against each other. Tollefsen appears to remedy this problem by simply asserting that "the experience of choice confirms the incommensurability of the goodness of options" (98) But is this assertion really true? This reminds me of Finnis's assertion that "practical reasonableness," which prohibits any commensuration of basic human goods, is itself a self-evident good. Even if the incommensurability of human goods is true, its truth hardly seems self-evident.

It is worth mentioning that even many of those ethical intuitionists who are deontologists are not absolutists, as they often make a distinction between prima facie and actual duties, as W. D. Ross did. Furthermore, there are also intuitionists (e.g., Sidgwick and Moore) who are utilitarians. Not all utilitarians deny the existence of intrinsic values, nor are all utilitarians act-utilitarians. It is not very helpful to lump everything together under the umbrella of consequentialism, as if proportionalism is identical to consequentialism, and all consequentialist ethics amount to act-utilitarianism.

One might also find issues with the theological premises underlying Tollefsen's absolutist position. For instance, in chapter 3 where he discusses Cassian, Bonhoeffer, and Niebuhr to consider (and to reject) the Christian case for lying, he says the following about sin and moral absolutes:

But, the absolutist holds . . . that the particular way that moral absolutes such as that against lying are framed in fact protects agents against dilemmas, by always leaving open a sinless alternative: the alternative of compliance with a moral absolute, even if the consequences are tragic. (72)

This passage as well as many others may leave one wondering if Tollefsen's absolutism is in fact motivated by his underlying belief that we can sometimes avoid sinning by making right choices even in some difficult situations. If this were the case, it would indeed explain a lot about not only the way Tollefsen responds to these thinkers, but also why he is so obsessed with absolute prohibition against any form of lying. It is one thing to say that we should try not to sin, but quite another to say that there are absolutely indubitable ways of not sinning. It is also worth noting that Tollefsen appears to treat 'moral' and 'sinless' as synonymous terms. The latter is a theological concept, while the former is not. There may be some overlapping areas between them, but one does not entail the other.

Despite my criticisms, I applaud Tollefsen for engaging a topic that is seldom discussed in contemporary Christian ethics and for forcing readers to think deeply about the nature of moral norms beyond just the morality of lying. It is certain that he puts contemporary Christian ethicists on notice that the new natural theory, despite its unpopularity in our society, is still alive and well.