Lying and Insincerity

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Andreas Stokke, Lying and Insincerity, Oxford University Press, 2018, 246pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198825968.

Reviewed by Paul Égré, Institut Jean Nicod/ENS


"La parole a été donnée à l'homme pour cacher sa pensée". Speech was given to man to conceal his thoughts. So writes Stendhal in an epigraph in The Red and the Black (chap. 22), crediting the Jesuit Father Gabriel Malagrida for the witty remark. Although this apocryphal citation is not included in Andreas Stokke's book, it may nicely serve to adorn and to describe Stokke's topic. He offers a brilliant and comprehensive study of the various ways in which language use allows us to be insincere: to express thoughts that we do not believe to be true (alternatively, to refrain from expressing thoughts we believe to be true, though the book puts less emphasis on that aspect).

The cornerstone of language use, following David Lewis's account in his classic paper "Languages and Language" (Philosophical Papers, vol. 1, Oxford University Press), resides in a convention of truthfulness and trust between speaker and hearer in their communicative exchanges. Indeed, as Stokke summarizes at the outset: "in the most ordinary case, A tells B something that A believes, whereby B comes to believe it" (p. 1). However, Stokke points out, "even though sincerity is demanded by our mutual dependence on information acquired from others, insincere forms of communication play a fundamental role in our interactions" (p. 3). Insincere speech is used for a variety of ends (thoroughly investigated by Stokke) not all of which need be harmful, for instance being polite and deliberately concealing one's actual opinion or preferences concerning a particular subject matter.

Stokke argues for several original theses concerning the nature of lying and the forms of insincere language use. The first such thesis concerns the definition of lying. Like many thinkers, Stokke uses as his backdrop the definition of lying based on Augustine's De Mendacio, whereby for A to lie to B, A must:

  1. utter a proposition P to B, such that
  2. A believes P to be false, and by which
  3. A intends to deceive B into believing that P.

The Augustinian definition remains an object of intense controversy amongst theorists of lying. According to some, for example, it may not suffice for A to say something she believes to be false in order to lie, if the proposition P uttered is in fact true. A further condition then is (iv) the proposition P uttered must actually be false (see for instance A. Turri & J. Turri, "The truth about lying", Cognition 138, 2015).

Stokke's definition rejects this objective requirement of falsity, and sticks to the subjective criterion of insincerity expressed by (ii), based on several examples that he argues for quite convincingly. One of them concerns Tony, a politician who wants to make the public believe that there are weapons of mass destruction in Iraq, despite believing on the basis of intelligence reports that there are no such weapons in Iraq. A war ensues and it is later discovered that the reports were mistaken and that there were in fact such weapons in Iraq. "I think it is clear that Tony lied to the public in this case", writes Stokke. I share Stokke's judgment: it appears that insincerity is a sufficient criterion for lying, and that insincerely expressing a belief that turns out true does not exonerate the speaker from actually lying.

Stokke's main originality isn't found in that rejection, however, but in his suggestion that we eliminate (iii). According to Stokke, although many or even most lies may be uttered with an intention to deceive the listener into believing that P, some lies do not fulfill that criterion. This concerns so-called bald-faced lies, particularly brought to the fore by T. Carson (see "The definition of lying", Noûs 40.2, 2006, where Carson too gives up clause (iii)) and by R. Sorensen ("Bald‐faced lies! Lying without the intent to deceive", Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 88.2, 2007). Bald-faced lies are false utterances made by a speaker in circumstances in which the speaker knows that everyone including the listener knows the utterance to be false, and everyone knows everyone knows this, and so on. A case widely discussed can be seen in F. Coppola's movie The Godfather, in which a witness, Pentangeli, declares in court "I never knew no godfather", despite having issued a written statement that he knew Corleone. Stokke characterizes the case as follows: "Pentangeli is not intending to deceive anyone about what he says." Instead, the witness is offering to make officially accepted a proposition that he does not believe to be true, in such a way that the godfather will be discharged, and so avoid retaliation against his own family. Bald-faced lies thus play a pivotal role in Stokke's approach, for they motivate giving up (iii) and substituting the clause that in uttering P

(iii') A proposes to make it common ground that P.

(iii') is more general than (iii) for it remains compatible with cases in which the speaker would intend to deceive his or her audience into believing P by making P part of the common ground.

One may question Stokke's emphasis on bald-faced lies, and also the analysis he gives of the phenomenon. Regarding the first, I think his suggestion that some insincere assertions may be made to force acceptance rather than belief proper has great merit. Stokke rightfully insists, for instance, that the Stalnakerian notion of common ground should be linked to the attitude of acceptance, rather than to belief or knowledge, precisely to account for the goal of bald-faced lies, which can be performed despite common knowledge of the falsity of the assertion made (that is, despite everyone knowing, everyone knowing that everyone knows, and so forth). I had a conversation several years ago with ***, a renowned economist and game theorist that provides some support for Stokke's enlightening remarks. We were discussing Israel's policy of deliberate ambiguity regarding the possession of nuclear weapons. I was surprised at first to hear *** say that even though it is common knowledge that Israel possesses nuclear weapons, it is still rational for Israel to deny that they do. In hindsight, the idea makes perfect sense if indeed making a public statement can go beyond making the information contained in it common knowledge. As explained by Stokke, to make a proposition common ground is to commit to some practical consequences of one's assertion, consequences additional to those commonly known (for instance, acknowledging the possession of nuclear weapons may put more pressure on Israel to comply with specific obligations or treaties).

Despite that, one may take issue with Stokke's claim that bald-faced lies are neither directly deceptive about the falsity of P nor indirectly deceptive about the beliefs of the speaker (p. 80). Pentangeli's denial in court may trigger doubts as to whether his previous statements were sincere, for example, and similarly Israel's denial may succeed at deceiving if even one country begins to doubt whether all others know for a fact that Israel possesses nuclear weapons. Bald-faced lies may therefore lead to a revision of the structure of what is common belief, rather than leave the structure of common belief unscathed. Similarly, suppose a criminal caught in the act denies having done it. One may wonder whether the criminal has normal epistemic capacities: do they see, perceive, and remember like we do? A bald-faced lie may not be completely free of any intention to deceive then, if ultimately it can lead one to question whether the speaker apprehends reality in the same way we do.

A second strength of Stokke's book is his distinction between lying and misleading, the topic of chapters 4 and 5. This distinction concerns utterances that are literally true, but which nevertheless misdirect the hearer toward false conclusions. An example is Abraham's truthful utterance that Sarah is his sister (which she is in one sense), to trigger the inference that Sarah is not his wife (which she is in fact). Another is the response "I have to work" made to the question "are you going to Paul's party?" when it is said in order to mislead the questioner into thinking that you will not go to the party because of your work. Yet another is Athanasius's response "he is not far away" to the question put by his pursuers "where is the traitor Athanasius?" to mislead them into thinking he is not Athanasius. For Stokke, such utterances trigger false implicatures, but that does not make them lies. Clear evidence in support of this is the fact that each such implicature can be cancelled by the speaker, without contradiction ("I have to work, but I might go despite that").

Stokke articulates a theory of the asserted content of utterances in relation to questions under discussion, which allows him to maintain a principled Gricean separation between what is literally said and what is implied. As Stokke mentions, the distinction is built "into law codes, and it is a basic distinction in many religious systems of beliefs. There are famous cases of presidents and saints having exploited the difference dexterously" (p. 77). While reference to religious and legal casuistry may raise some eyebrows, the line drawn by Stokke between semantic content and pragmatic inference is conceptually clear and irreproachable, and carefully buttressed. In particular, he should not be misunderstood to be saying that making a misleading assertion is morally better than stating an outright lie. Stokke's point is conceptual and linguistic, and is morally neutral. His approach, incidentally, concurs with observations made independently by N. Asher and A. Lascarides ("Strategic Conversation", Semantics and Pragmatics 6, 2013). They emphasize that "misdirection is quite different from lying", based in particular on the famous case Bronston v. The United States, discussed by L. Solan and P. Tiersma (Speaking of Crime: The Language of Criminal Justice, 2005, Chicago IL: The University of Chicago Press), concerning Samuel Bronston's misleading response as to whether he possessed a bank account in Switzerland ("The company had an account in Zürich for six months").

Stokke's first five chapters deal with the definition of lying and the difference between lying and misleading. The second five discuss three main topics: the relation of lying to bullshitting, the notion of insincerity, and the issue of whether non-declarative utterances (questions, exclamatives, imperatives) may be used insincerely and whether they can communicate lies.

Chapters 6 and 7 are concerned with H. Frankfurt's definition of bullshitting as (unlike lying) expressing indifference toward truth on the side of the speaker. Stokke basically accepts the distinction made by Frankfurt, but refines it by pointing out that a bullshitter fundamentally lacks concern for the question under discussion. For example, in some cases carefully discussed in the book, someone might care about only saying true things while still flouting the Gricean maxim of relevance, thereby bullshitting. Stokke also admits, like Frankfurt in his later writings, that one may lie and bullshit at the same time, but points out that the occasional coincidence does not fundamentally affect the notional distinction between the two kinds of attitudes.

Chapters 8 and 9 discuss the forms of insincerity, and in particular the epistemic access that a speaker may have toward her beliefs. Stokke contrasts two views of insincere belief, that depend on whether the beliefs in question are conscious or not. The view defended by Stokke is what he calls "shallow insincerity": in order to be insincere, it suffices to have conscious beliefs that not P and to utter P, even if one's unconscious beliefs actually support P to some extent. In those two chapters, Stokke's account presents the same virtue of parsimony exemplified in his adherence to the subjective as opposed to objective definition of lying: even though Stokke acknowledges that deep beliefs and ultimate reasons may escape an agent's conscious access, his account of insincerity is grounded in what the agent can be held responsible for, namely the agent's conscious motives and explicit beliefs. This broadly internalist perspective on lying and insincerity is coherent and simple, and in both cases the account is efficiently argued for. Chapter 10, finally, defends the view that only declarative utterances can express lies, but that non-declarative utterances can nevertheless be used to express various insincere attitudes. For instance, Stokke considers that one might ask a question without being fundamentally interested in the answer, a case he describes as non-declarative bullshitting, since the question does not contribute useful information toward communal inquiry.

Stokke's book is well-written and highly stimulating, resting on a host of carefully selected and controlled examples, analyzed with rigor and vividness. It is accessible to novices, seeking a first systematic introduction to the topic of lying and deception, and of interest to more advanced readers specializing in the philosophy of language and the philosophy of mind. The book should also be recommended to theorists of communication, including intelligence officers and political thinkers, given the permanence and timeliness of its topic. On the notions of lying and bullshitting, it brings clarity and avoids sophistry, making its contribution informative, relevant, and trustworthy.


Thanks to Benjamin Icard, Emar Maier and Merel Semeijn for helpful comments.