Lying, Cheating, and Stealing: A Moral Theory of White-Collar Crime

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Stuart P. Green, Lying, Cheating, and Stealing: A Moral Theory of White-Collar Crime, Oxford University Press, 2006, 284pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199225804.

Reviewed by Denis G. Arnold, University of Tennessee, Knoxville


The term 'white-collar crime' has been in common usage in the United States for nearly seventy years and is increasingly used abroad.  Despite this, Stuart Green notes that there is little agreement across or within disciplines such as law, philosophy, and sociology regarding the precise meaning of the term.  For the purposes of moral and legal theory he approaches the concept as one pertaining to criminal law that involves certain family resemblances rather than necessary and sufficient conditions.  This approach allows Green to include most commonly understood acts of white-collar criminality (e.g., perjury, fraud, bribery, extortion, and tax evasion) within the scope of his definition.  This book is divided into three main parts.  In Part I he identifies three primary traits indicative of white-collar crime:  mens rea, harmfulness, and wrongfulness.  By wrongfulness he means the violation of everyday moral norms such as those against cheating, deception, coercion, exploitation and promise-breaking.  This approach, argues Green, has the distinct advantage of avoiding a "maddeningly abstract" rights approach to wrongfulness (45).  While acknowledging the contested conceptual status of everyday moral norms, Green believes that most people are quite capable of making fine-grained distinctions about the application of these concepts.  The remainder of the book is devoted to the explication of these moral norms and their use in the assessment of federal statutes pertaining to ten white-collar crimes.

For Green's project to be successful, he needs to provide a persuasive analysis of everyday moral concepts and persuade the reader that there exists a commonly understood core notion in each case.  This is the task of Part II of the book where he analyzes eight moral concepts:  cheating, deception, stealing, coercion, exploitation, disloyalty, promise-breaking, and disobedience.  Here Green's analysis is only partly successful.  With respect to the simplest concepts at issue, such as cheating and stealing, Green successfully defends common sense, core notions.  For example, Green disagrees with those who argue that deception is a necessary condition of cheating.  To illustrate his point he uses the example of a driver using the soft shoulder of the highway to pass congested traffic.  According to Green, the driver is cheating but not acting deceptively.  One might argue that such a driver is trying to act deceptively, since he or she will be caught and punished only when his or her identity is ascertained by law enforcement.  Nonetheless, other examples can no doubt be found to make his point that cheating sometimes, but not always, involves deception.  Green goes on to plausibly define cheating as a person's violation of "a fair and fairly enforced rule … with the intent to obtain an advantage over a party with whom she is in a cooperative, rule-bound relationship" (57).  However, Green is less successful with more complex concepts.  Consider his analysis of coercion and exploitation.  Here Green provides a succinct exposition of the literature on each concept and then acknowledges that scholars disagree about the precise meanings of these concepts.  He provides no evidence that ordinary people share common understandings of these concepts.  But if there is no clear scholarly consensus regarding the meanings of these concepts, and no common, ordinary language understandings of these concepts, one wonders how these concepts can help us to understand white-collar crime.  The fact that these concepts are unhelpful to his task (at least as explicated by Green) becomes clear in his discussion of extortion in Part III of the book.  But even before we get to Part III it is apparent that Green's assumption that there are common understandings of coercion and exploitation and that most people are capable of fine-grained applications of these concepts is left wanting.  After all, he does not provide such applications himself.

Part III is devoted to an examination of the moral content of ten white collar offenses:  perjury, fraud, false statements, obstructions of justice, bribery, extortion, blackmail, insider trading, tax evasion, and a class of 'failure-to-comply' regulatory crimes.  Green uses the tripartite analysis in Part I, along with the moral norms developed in Part II, in order to assess the ways these offenses are defined in leading federal statutes.  Here he has mixed success.  In his chapter on bribery, for example, he plausibly argues that the wrongfulness of bribery is grounded in disloyalty to persons or a cause or ideal.  This helps us to understand why both an elected politician and an appointed judge act wrongfully when they accept bribes.  However, in explaining what is wrong with the act of offering a bribe his argument is less persuasive.  Green's argument is that the briber induces the bribee to be disloyal.  While this may be part of the wrongfulness of offering a bribe, it is not the entire picture.  Those who offer bribes attempt to cheat by circumventing the norms of particular practices or institutions and thereby undermine the integrity of those institutions.  This is part of the harm caused by bribes and needs to be discussed and linked to his account of cheating.  His chapter on extortion and blackmail is more problematic.  Having argued in Part II that coercion is an essentially contested concept he inexplicably adapts a moralized account of coercion (rather than the competing empirical view) in order to analyze alleged cases of extortion where the question of whether or not coercion has taken place is important.  His reasons for adapting a moralized account of coercion are left unexpressed and his analysis of extortion is thereby undermined.  It is also surprising that his prior discussion of exploitation in Part II plays no substantive role in his discussion of extortion and blackmail or any of the other white-collar crimes discussed in Part III.

The white-collar crimes discussed in this book deserve careful philosophical attention.  However, because Green is inconsistent in the attention he provides to these crimes his project has only limited success.  A book twice the length of Lying, Cheating, and Stealing would have been necessary to plausibly defend all of Green's conclusions.