Lying: Language, Knowledge, Ethics, and Politics

Placeholder book cover

Eliot Michaelson and Andreas Stokke (eds.), Lying: Language, Knowledge, Ethics, and Politics, Oxford University Press, 2018, 320pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198743965.

Reviewed by Emanuel Viebahn, Humboldt University of Berlin


The communicative act of lying is the focus of a burgeoning debate in applied philosophy of language. Philosophers of language are interested in questions such as: What kind of communicative act is lying? How does lying differ from other forms of insincerity? But these questions clearly also matter for questions in epistemology, ethics and political philosophy. For instance, they matter for the question whether lying and mere misleading differ in a way that is morally relevant.

The collection of essays edited by Eliot Michaelson and Andreas Stokke does justice to the inter-subdisciplinary significance of lying and other forms of insincerity by covering all four of the areas mentioned above. It contains three essays each on the language and on the epistemology of insincerity, five essays on the ethics of insincerity and four essays on political dimensions of insincerity. In addition, the editors provide an introduction that includes a helpful historical overview of work in the area. The essays are by leading contributors to the debate and cover a good range of topics: together they not only move forward existing inquiries about lying and insincerity, but also open up new avenues of research.

A first, well-established question (touched on in many of the essays) is: Does lying require an intention to deceive? Until the beginning of this millennium, this question would standardly have been answered positively. This is reflected in the third clause of the traditional definition of lying, according to which a communicative agent A lies to an addressee B iff there is a proposition p such that:

(i) A asserts p to B,

(ii) A believes that p is false, and

(iii) A intends to deceive B with respect to p.

However, following influential papers by Thomas Carson (2006) and Roy Sorensen (2007), views on this matter have changed drastically. Nowadays, most theorists hold that certain lies, which are usually labelled bald-faced lies, do not involve an intention to deceive. Perhaps the best case for a bald-faced lie is provided by Carson's (2006: 290) example of the cheating student: Having been caught cheating in an exam, a student faces the dean, who has unassailable evidence of the student's offence. For fear of potential lawsuits, the dean only punishes students who admit their offences. The student knows this, so utters: "I did not cheat in the exam". The most common reaction to this case is (i) that the student is lying, and (ii) that he does not intend to deceive the dean with respect to having cheated. Due to cases of this kind, most recent definitions of lying do not require an intention to deceive.

In "Lying, Acting, and Asserting", Ishani Maitra goes against this trend by arguing that examples such as the one above should not be classified as lies. In brief, she first offers support for the common view (encapsulated in the first clause of the traditional definition above) that lying requires asserting. One of the reasons she gives in favour of this view is that liars can legitimately be challenged in ways that are typical for assertions, e.g., with "How do you know that?". Then, Maitra argues that Carson's example and other examples of supposedly bald-faced lies strongly resemble instances of theatrical performances, and thus do not involve proper assertions.

While Maitra provides a strong case for lies being assertions, her argument against the assertive status of supposed bald-faced lies is not as forceful. Indeed, it seems that her own criterion of legitimate challengeability supports some of the cases involving assertions. To be sure, it would be strange to challenge the student in Carson's example with "How do you know that?". But the oddness of this challenge is arguably explained by the fact that the student's purported reason for knowing is obvious. In a slightly different version of the example, in which (for some reason) a professor defends the student by uttering "The student did not cheat on the exam", it would be entirely appropriate to challenge this with "How do you know that?" or "Do you actually know that?" (upon which the professor would have to put forward further lies or retract the original commitment). This suggests that there are examples of bald-faced lies that do involve assertions, and thus seems to offer some support for the possibility of bald-faced lies.

Although Maitra's is the only essay to focus directly on bald-faced lies, others in the collection shed light on the topic. One of these is Katherine Hawley's "Coercion and Lies". Hawley's main question is whether coerced utterances can be lies. Through comparison with other coerced actions (involving coerced 'gifts' or coerced 'promises', which arguably cannot be genuine gifts or genuine promises), Hawley convincingly argues that coerced utterances cannot be genuine lies. One of the reasons she gives is closely related to the criterion of challengeability discussed above: Hawley shows that with coerced utterances, communicative agents do not make themselves answerable for the content they put forward. Nonetheless, she argues, that does not mean that any coerced 'lie' is justified: 'lies' involving non-overwhelming coercion may fail to be genuine lies, but may nonetheless be unjustified.

Hawley's point matters for the debate on bald-faced lies, as several prominent examples of bald-faced lies involve coerced utterances. For instance, Sorensen (2007) presents coerced utterances in a totalitarian state as examples of bald-faced lies. If these utterances are indeed coerced and if Hawley is right, such utterances cannot be lies. But what prevents them from being lies is the fact that they are coerced, and not necessarily the lack of an intention to deceive. This, in turn, shows that arguments against the possibility of bald-faced lies are inconclusive insofar as they focus only on examples involving coerced utterances (as is the case, e.g., with the argument given in Leland 2015). Opponents of bald-faced lies should rather focus on non-coerced utterances, such as the example of the cheating student.

A third essay relevant for the debate on bald-faced lies is Sorensen's "Lying to Mindless Machines". Sorensen argues that we frequently lie to computers, for instance when we install software and confirm that we have read the terms of service. If it is granted that computers do not have mental states (which seems plausible at the time of writing), then it is impossible to deceive a computer. And if communicative agents believe that it is impossible to deceive a computer, they will not have an intention to deceive the computer while confirming that they have read the terms of service. So, by making the case for the possibility of lying to computers, Sorensen also supports the possibility of bald-faced lies (as he notes himself).

One interesting aspect of bald-faced lies to computers is their apparent immunity to an objection by Jennifer Lackey (2013); this objection is also mentioned in her essay "Group Lies". Lackey argues that, contrary to initial appearances, examples of bald-faced lies involve an intention to be deceptive after all: even if the student in Carson's example does not intend to convince the dean that he did not cheat on the exam, he nonetheless intends his utterance to be deceptive by concealing evidence that would be needed for his punishment. But if lies to computers are bald-faced lies, and if (at least some) communicative agents believe that computers fail to have mental states, there appear to be some bald-faced lies that do not involve any kind of intention to be deceptive.

Of course, none of the foregoing considerations are conclusive, and the debate on whether lying requires an intention to deceive is far from being over. But I hope it has become clear how various essays in this collection, which are concerned with quite diverse topics, can jointly move this debate forward. What is more, the essays by Hawley, Sorensen and Lackey fall within the 'Politics' section, which illustrates how research on lying and insincerity can benefit from an integrative approach that crosses boundaries of traditional philosophical subdisciplines.

Let us now turn to a second, well-established question addressed in several essays: Is there a morally relevant difference between lying and mere misleading? This question is directly tackled in "Lying and Misleading: A Moral Difference" by the late Jonathan Adler. While Adler's essay has been circulating and received discussion since at least 2012, it had not previously been published, and the editors are to be applauded for making it publicly accessible. The traditional view on this topic is that, if faced with a choice to lie or to merely mislead, we should go for the second option (everything else being equal and except in certain special cases). This view has recently been challenged, most notably by Jennifer M. Saul (2012), who argues that there is no morally relevant difference between lying and misleading (again, everything else being equal and except in certain special cases).

Adler was a prominent defender of the traditional view; accordingly, his aim here is to argue that "ethical rules against lying should be more stringent than those against intentional misleading" (301). The essay offers a host of ideas in support of this claim. Understandably, not all of them are fully developed, but they can still serve as helpful pointers for ways forward in the debate. For instance, Adler mentions that "intentional misleading is the better act because you stand behind your assertion in a stronger way than the implicature" (316). And he observes a difference in challengeability between lying and mere misleading (308), along the lines mentioned above. These observations about differences between lying and mere misleading seem to be on the mark, as I have argued (Viebahn 2019a). At the same time, it is not clear that they can be used to ground a general moral difference between lying and misleading (e.g., a general preference for misleading). Nonetheless, it is worth exploring further whether lying and misleading involve speech-acts of different strength, and whether this difference could be used to ground a moral difference in at least some cases.

The ethics of lying and misleading also features in Michaelson's "The Lies We Tell Each Other Together". Michaelson introduces intriguing examples in which several agents jointly construct a lie. In one of his cases, such a joint lie helps to sustain the cohesion of a family in adverse circumstances: an uncle has been unfairly advantaged through a will, but other family members assert that the will was fair so as not to drive away the uncle. Michaelson uses such cases to object to Seana Shiffrin's (2014) view, according to which the distinctive wrong of lying is that it damages reliable channels of communication. The example indeed suggests that, at least in some cases, lies can be used to preserve channels of communication -- in the absence of the lie the uncle would have been driven away and communication with him would have become more difficult. But Michaelson also responds to other arguments Shiffrin puts forward in favour of a difference between lying and misleading. For instance, Shiffrin holds that liars, but not misleaders, present a testimonial warrant for what they put forward. Michaelson objects that misleading can involve such a testimonial warrant, too. But here one may wonder whether the difference in challengeability noted above indicates that the testimonial warrant is weaker in cases of misleading, which might be taken to support Shiffrin's position. Be that as it may, Michaelson's essay is also worth reading for other reasons: firstly, his case of the uncle and the will appears to be another example of bald-faced lying; and secondly, Michaelson argues that the example presents a problem for Robert Stalnaker's theory of assertion, which has also entered the debate on lying through the definition proposed by Stokke (2018).

Apart from addressing these two established questions, the collection also opens up new fields of research. For instance, Jessica Pepp's "Truth Serum, Liar Serum, and Some Problems about Saying What You Think Is False" shows that further work is required on the second clause of the traditional definition, according to which liars must believe the asserted content to be false. Pepp makes a convincing case for a reassessment of this clause by discussing examples involving divided or unconscious belief. In "Negligent Falsehood, White Ignorance, and False News", Saul uses insightful real-life examples to draw attention to communicative practices that are not lies in the strict sense, but are no less harmful in spreading falsehoods and misconceptions. And "Group Lies" by Lackey highlights the possibility of lies told by groups, such as corporations and governments, and proposes a definition to capture such lies. These and other essays in the collection will serve as starting points for further sub-debates in the area of lying and insincerity. They make it apparent that the editors have done an excellent job in bringing together essays on diverse topics and balancing work on existing questions with novel outlooks.

Two areas receive very limited coverage in the collection. On the one hand, there is a growing body of empirical work on intuitions about insincerity and the use of terms such as 'lying' (see Wiegmann and Meibauer 2019 for an overview). This approach receives only one brief mention in Don Fallis's "What is Deceptive Lying?". On the other hand, almost all of the essays focus on lying as a purely linguistic phenomenon (Saul's essay is the exception, but even Saul holds that 'lie' in its strict sense applies only to linguistic utterances). But a case can be made for the possibility of lying with pictures, such as doctored photographs (see Viebahn 2019b).

However, this minor criticism should not detract from the quality of this collection and its many excellent contributions, which I would highly recommend to those working in the field or with an interest in the topic.


I would like to thank Felix Timmermann and Victoria Viebahn for helpful comments and discussion.


Carson, T. 2006: The definition of lying. Noûs 40: 284-306.

Leland, P. 2015: Rational responsibility and the assertoric character of bald-faced lies. Analysis 75: 550-554.

Saul, J. M. 2012: Lying, Misleading, and What is Said. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Shiffrin, S. 2014: Speech matters: On lying, morality, and the law. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Sorensen, R. 2007: Bald-faced lies! Lying without the intent to deceive. Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 88: 251-264.

Stokke, A. 2018: Lying and Insincerity. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Viebahn, E. 2019a: Lying with presuppositions. Noûs: Online First.

Viebahn, E. 2019b: Lying with pictures. British Journal of Aesthetics: Online First.

Wiegmann, A. and Meibauer, J. 2019: The folk concept of lying. Philosophy Compass 14.