Machiavelli, Hobbes, and Rousseau

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John Plamenatz, Machiavelli, Hobbes, and Rousseau, Mark Philp and Z.A. Pelczynski (eds.), Oxford University Press, 2012, 320pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199645060.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Collins, Queen's University, Kingston Ontario


This posthumous volume presents a series of lectures written by John Plamenatz and intended for delivery in 1975 at Cambridge. Plamenatz, known today primarily for his 1963 work Man and Society: A Critical Examination of Some Important Social and Political Theories from Machiavelli to Marx, was in 1975 the Chichele Professor of Social and Political Thought at Oxford. He had been invited to Cambridge as a visitor, replacing for one year Quentin Skinner, who was to be on leave at Princeton. Plamenatz in fact suffered a stroke and died in 1975. The lectures were never delivered.

The book is divided into eighteen parts: an introductory lecture, five lectures dedicated to the thought of Machiavelli, five to Hobbes, and seven to Rousseau. The lectures had been fully written out and corrected by Plamenatz before his death. For some years they remained, along with the rest of Plamenatz's papers, in the possession of Robert Wokler, who died in 2006 before editing and publishing the lectures. The editorial work presented here was undertaken by Z.A. Pelczynski, emeritus fellow of Pembroke College, Oxford, and Mark Philp, a current fellow at Oriel College, Oxford. By this circuitous route, Plamenatz's lectures, now undergirded with critical notes but generally unchanged as a text, have appeared nearly four decades after their composition.

The value of this publication is not entirely easy to ascertain. Published lecture series are not uncommon, but typically they represent discreet lecture sets on particular topics designed, from the start, to inform a published book. The Gifford Lectures and the Trevelyan Lectures are series of this kind. Far rarer are examples of student lectures being published in book form. Perhaps the most prominent examples of this sort of publication are John Rawls's published Lectures on the History of Political Philosophy and Lectures on the History of Moral Philosophy, both of which were based on his undergraduate courses at Harvard.

The value of such a publication of student lectures might derive from the inherent quality of the analysis they offer, but more often such lectures evidence the historical importance of the lecturer, whose every utterance is understood to constitute an artifact from a self-evidently significant intellectual biography. It is an open question whether, by either of these standards, Plamenatz's lectures merit publication. To be sure, in his day Plamenatz was undoubtedly a significant figure in the field of political thought. Born in 1912 in Montenegro, he was raised in Britain and educated at Oxford, where he enjoyed a long academic career interrupted by service in World War II and a stint in the cabinet of the exiled Yugoslav King Peter. His contemporary, Isaiah Berlin, writing in the Oxford Dictionary of National Biography, described him as "one of the most respected (and prolific) writers on political theory in the English-speaking world." But Berlin conceded that Plamenatz

developed no theoretical system of his own, sought no unifying historical or metaphysical pattern, and neither belonged to nor created a school of political thought. For forty years he was engaged in the exposition and criticism of the classical political texts of the West, seeking to sift the true from the false, the profound from the shallow, substance from rhetoric, in a lifelong effort to examine the relations of the individual to society.

Another way of putting this is to characterize Plamenatz as a major figure in the field of political thought at a time when that field was still oriented around the authority of the Western canon. Plamenatz, in his introductory lecture, justifies his focus on Machiavelli, Hobbes, and Rousseau by characterizing them as "the most original and challenging social and political thinkers between the end of the Middle Ages and the time of Hegel and Marx." This sort of trans-historical deference is very rare among more recent political theorists, particularly in the United States. Plamenatz belonged to an era in which some of the most prominent political theorists, including Leo Strauss, Berlin himself, and more recent figures such as Harvey Mansfield, still wrote in a fundamentally historical idiom. This style in some ways reflected the long hey-day of "Western Civilization" as an academic subject and staple of university education. For good or ill, that day has passed. Scholars of the political philosophical canon are becoming increasingly rare in departments of political science.

Which is not to suggest that major, canonical figures such as Machiavelli, Hobbes, and Rousseau do not continue to command attention. Each of these figures looms over sub-fields of virtually industrial productivity. But the subjects that interested Plamenatz have increasingly gravitated toward the field of history itself. This is in no small part due to the watershed methodological interventions of the so-called "Cambridge School" of intellectual history. Beginning with the scholarship of Maurice Cranston and John Dunn, continuing with the monumental publications of John Pocock and Quentin Skinner, the major political theorists of Europe and (above all) Britain became the subject of a rigorously contextualist method in the 1960s and 1970s. This method dominates intellectual history to this day. Cambridge School contextualism has been heavily concentrated on political theorists of the past, particularly those typically arrayed for or against a perceived "liberal" tradition that is at once the School's foil and its enduring fascination. Influenced by 20th century linguistic philosophy, it seeks to fix canonical texts within past idioms and discourse traditions. It charts the evolution of language, and the "political acts" intended by small linguistic innovations. Deeply hostile to anachronism, trans-historical presumptions, or the presumed existence of perennial political problems, the method often functions in a debunking mode. Rather than a useful storehouse of concepts, past writers present us with discontinuity, foreignness, and even incommensurability.

To make these generalizations is to explain the decline in Plamenatz's profile, if not his reputation. As Berlin noted, "Plamenatz believed in and rigorously practiced careful, rational analysis" of past texts, but he had little interest in "understanding the motives, purposes, social, historical and personal circumstances" of his subjects. He "seemed to move in a timeless world of great thinkers who spoke directly to him." In their own editorial introduction, Philp and Pelczynski remain very cognizant that Plamenatz's method will strike most readers as old-fashioned. They begin, indeed, by noting the "irony" of his stint as Skinner's replacement at Cambridge. Both Skinner and Dunn had criticized Plamenatz in their various writings for his rigorously textual method, which they took to be the epitome of the fusty academic traditions that they intended to disrupt.

For all of these reasons, the most interesting aspect of this publication is in many respects its critical apparatus. In their introduction Philp and Pelczynski attempt to come to grips with the achievement of Plamenatz as it appears today, after the contextualist wave has largely erased the intellectual world that he inhabited. Interestingly, they understand him to have been writing against the more anti-humanistic implications of what was, in Plamenatz's day and in England, the reigning method of logical positivism. "Logical positivists and their successors believed that meaningful statements had to have a clear propositional sense that could be verified or refuted. For most logical positivists, metaphysical, religious, aesthetic, and ethical claims were largely meaningless (X)." Plamenatz resisted this obsessive factuality, and defended the study of political thought as a normative, value-oriented discipline. To some extent, the implication is, he would have understood an obsession with historical context as another form of faux-scientific "neutrality", a vain attempt to escape moral debate by seeking a quasi-objective detachment.

Philp and Pelczynski are sympathetic to Plamenatz, and push back against the disdain with which the contextualists have treated his advice that we read the great texts "over and over again", and his belief that "we learn more about their arguments by weighing them over and over again than by extending our knowledge of the circumstances in which they wrote (xiii)." Their brief for the defense largely consists of an effort to juxtapose these lectures -- the last and most considered interpretations of Plamenatz, and "substantially developed" over his older Man and Society -- with more recent, and largely contextual, scholarship on Machiavelli, Hobbes and Rousseau. They try to place his interpretations in dialogue with this more up-to-date work.

Their hurdle is, however, a high one. As they are forced to acknowledge repeatedly, scholarship has "undergone a transformation in the last forty years." For instance, Plamenatz has very little to say about Machiavelli's use of concepts such as virtù, fortuna, and necessità. These terms have evolved fundamentally over the centuries, and are notoriously easy to misinterpret by those armed with a strictly textualist method. Or consider another example: as the editors concede, Plamenatz's interpretation of Hobbes is very much defined by the battle over Howard Warrender's famous case for Hobbes's theism based upon the logical requirements of the account of political obligation found in Leviathan. Plamenatz dissented from Warrender, but he shared, in some sense, his method of applying a generous interpretive charity to Leviathan and striving to make the text both transparent and perfectly consistent.

In their introduction and critical notes, the editors usefully indicate where modern scholarship has changed interpretive consensus, or where historical work has posed interpretive problems that would not have occurred to Plamenatz. But reading the lectures themselves remains a jarringly unfamiliar tour through the thickets of dated academic assumptions. For instance, very few would today agree with his assertion that these three thinkers are "fundamentally secular", "in the sense that" their thinking "rests entirely on assumptions about man and his situation in this world." Such a perspective, which pervades the full lectures, was perhaps plausible during an era when social scientific models of development presumed the decline of religion. The inevitability of secularism is no longer either a sociological or an historical truism. Or consider Plamenatz's claim of Machiavelli, Hobbes, and Rousseau that "the idea of progress has no place in their social and political theories, secular though those theories are." Leaving aside the suggestion that "theories of progress" are somehow inherently secular, the broader assertion here would strike most current historians of political theory as a question ill-posed. The concept of "progress" is largely an observer's category, a covering theme imposed on the textual artifacts of the past rather than arising naturally from them. Another oddity of these lectures, again reflecting their presumed status as canonical authorities situated against perennial questions rather than as historically fixed interventions in defined political debates, is their explicit failure to consider the "influence of one thinker on another." This is particularly awkward in the case of Rousseau, on whom, Plamenatz acknowledged, the influence of Machiavelli and Hobbes is obvious and explicit.

In short, Plamenatz's lectures represent a staunchly ahistorical, analytic approach to texts that we today almost reflexively consider as historically situated (which is not to suggest that they are irrelevant to us, but merely that our interpretive techniques cannot be freed from a pervasive historical awareness). To the extent that other published interpretations figure in his own, Plamenatz -- by and large -- engaged with long forgotten works that shared his own methodology. These outmoded qualities of Plamenatz's method are somehow more glaring when presented in lecture format, where methodological assumptions are necessarily not spelled out or justified fully, and where questionable covering "themes" (such as secularism or progress) are deployed more casually than they might be in a published book.

To be sure, Plamenatz was an exceptionally well-read man of vast intelligence, applying his mind to self-evidently important questions. His local observations and individual interpretations are often quite sound. They defy summary here, as the lectures range fairly widely over a set of standard philosophical problems. But some brief tour of their high points should be offered.

Plamenatz's account of Machiavelli is perhaps the weakest section of the lecture series. His discussion of Machiavelli's "excusing in Rulers and leaders actions ordinarily condemned as immoral" is apologetic, and makes some reasonable points about the need for moral latitude required of office holders in extraordinary circumstances. But he somewhat dubiously strives to diminish Machiavelli's hostility to Christianity, and his discussion enters rough territory when he delves into the topic of "attitudes toward great men" by ranging over the legacies of Hitler, Lenin, and Stalin. His effort to contrast The Prince and the Discourses on Livy is rather seriously hindered by his misdating the latter work by 18 years, thus incorrectly giving chronological priority to the former work. (This is rather gently pointed out by the editors.) On the whole, Plamenatz's discussion of Machiavelli is scattered and often anachronistic. Machiavelli's texts, perhaps more than those of Hobbes and Rousseau, belong to an alien context, represent unfamiliar genres of writing, and deploy a largely forgotten set of concepts and language. The weaknesses of a purely textual method are thus particularly exposed in discussions of his work that deploy the method.

Plamenatz's account of Hobbes's theory of obligation and covenant -- if, again, somewhat overly defined by the terms of the Warrender thesis -- is comprehensive and judicious, and makes some shrewd observations about the ambiguous position of the Hobbesian sovereign in creating the conditions for justice. His analysis of sovereign power and resistance in Hobbes makes some subtle and often ignored points about the difference between sovereign power and sovereign right, and about the capacity of sovereigns to act "iniquitously" even when they cannot be accused of "injustice". (This discussion of the Hobbesian sovereign, however, was not in a position to benefit from Skinner's path breaking work on the concept of "personation" in Hobbes's thought.) Plamenatz's discussion of the right of resistance is also well done, and correctly perceives that what is often presented as a very narrow right in Hobbes is potentially a fairly expansive individual right of judgment. Somewhat less steady is his discussion of Hobbes's account of religious doctrine and religious conscience, a subject on which a great deal of work has been done since Plamenatz wrote. Nevertheless, even here he manages to extract some quasi-tolerationist passages from Hobbes that were generally overlooked in his day, but became fundamental to later revisionist scholarship.

Also interesting are the seven lectures on Rousseau. As Philp and Pelczynski note, these range very widely over Rousseau's large and varied corpus. The Rousseau lectures are in many respects more opinionated than those on Hobbes and Machiavelli, taking issue in particular with Rousseau's account of freedom. His account accommodates Rousseau's theory of human freedom, his attending dedication to human equality, and his preference for small communal polities. He offers a particularly useful discussion of the contrast between Hobbes's account of freedom as a mere absence of external impediments with Rousseau's belief that freedom was "the ability to satisfy his wants without the help of others, and also in his not being subject to the will of others." Plamenatz's discussion of Rousseau's account of inequality is also surefooted, and avails itself of often neglected texts such as the Considerations on the Government of Poland.

There is, in short, a fair amount of thought provoking textual analysis in these lectures. Particularly on Hobbes and Rousseau, they provide a serviceable introduction to a selection of important themes. For anything more than that, the lectures are too outdated to be of a great deal of use to readers unfamiliar or uninterested in Plamenatz's earlier writings.