Machiavelli's Ethics

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Erica Benner, Machiavelli's Ethics, Princeton UP, 2009, 527pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780691141770.

Reviewed by Cary J. Nederman, Texas A&M University



To the casual reader, the title of this book may seem ironic, oxymoronic, or, worse still, a joke. After all, Machiavelli is commonly regarded as the quintessential example of an amoral, even immoral, proponent of Realpolitik, authorizing deception and violence as legitimate political tools. But Benner’s book is intended to dispel the illusions of the casual reader, and she is very serious indeed about the meaning of her title (to the point that there is no subtitle). Her aim is to extract and reconstruct from Machiavelli’s "main political works (the Prince, Art of War, Florentine Histories and Discourses)" (p. 6) — with occasional nods to his poetry and other “minor” writings — a coherent set of moral principles and to demonstrate how these were consistently applied by him to salient issues of public affairs. Her reading yields an innovative and stimulating interpretation of a notoriously difficult (even slippery) author that is meant to reveal his distinctive contribution to philosophical concerns. Benner’s insights are often surprising and challenging, and not always convincing (about which more below), but are definitely worthy of careful consideration. This big book makes big claims and supports them with a plethora of textual evidence.

It is beyond the scope of the present review to attempt a thorough summary of the complex arguments on which Benner builds her case. Rather, I will highlight what I take to be her two main (and interrelated) claims. First, she ascribes to Machiavelli an individualistic ethics that she explicitly identifies as deontological in character and that she regards as logically prior to and the foundation for his political ethics. According to Benner, Machiavelli’s moral precepts are rooted in his conception of human agency as “bounded” and responsible: he posits that human nature generates a capacity for choice and action that permits people to overcome external forces (such as “fortune”) in order to realize tangible moral goods. Primary among such goods, she asserts, is justice. In Chapter 8, she seeks to demonstrate that Machiavelli articulated across the range of his writings a cogent conception of justice — where justice is understood to be the acceptance of the worth and dignity of other humans who also possess freedom, even (or especially) if they are less well positioned to realize their wishes — as the deserving object of the human will. This view of justice as tied to human volition forms, in turn, the basis for Machiavelli’s preference for republican institutions, in which the common good, embodied in law, is authorized by popular consent (see pp. 282-285). As Benner sums up her thesis in her concluding remarks,

the most basic principles of good [political] order are also principles of justice. And a proper understanding of justice takes account of the claims and perceptions of all parties, considered as equally free agents whose power of authorization deserves respect, even if some are much weaker than others. This, I submit, is the … core ‘teaching’ of all Machiavelli’s political writings (p. 484).

Benner’s Machiavelli does indeed forward a “political ethics,” with emphasis on the latter word rather the former, in contrast to the standard interpretation. Morality, conceived as decisions and conduct limited by recognition of the legitimate claims of one’s fellow moral agents, constitutes the best (and perhaps only true) foundation for political life, where “best” is understood in a double sense of both morally defensible and politically secure.

On the basis of her version of Machiavelli’s core teaching, Benner reinterprets many of the familiar terms of his moral discourse. Virtù, for instance, comes to be closely aligned with more conventional conceptions of virtue and free will: "modes of action that deserve to be called virtuouso are by definition modes that recognize the necessity to respect constraints or limits (termine)" (p. 215). Likewise, ambizione is viewed not as a uniformly positive quality of human action, but rather as a natural disposition in need of careful regulation through institutional and legal remedies (e.g., pp. 378-379). Ambition stands in contrast to virtù to the extent that it potentially knows no bounds or limits. And the (in)famously Machiavellian theme of “ends-justify-means” must be qualified by prior examination of whether the means are themselves just (see pp. 340-343). The warrant for Benner’s radical restructuring of Machiavelli’s moral language derives from the second major facet of her overarching argument, namely, that his ethical principles are heavily indebted to the Greek tradition of thought as found in the works of Plato, Thucydides, Plutarch, and Xenophon, as well as in some of their Latin imitators. This claim is defended systematically in Chapter 2, with many further parallels elucidated throughout the entire book (often in the footnotes). In particular, Benner reads Machiavelli as a kind of Socratic, dialectical thinker whose doctrines cannot be taken at face value, but who instead must be read “against the grain,” as a genuine philosopher seeking “to challenge, exercise, and improve readers’ capacities to make discriminating moral and political judgments” (p. 484; see pp. 485-486). Thus, Machiavelli is seen to champion a Greek style of thinking and writing that is “self-critical” rather than “self-celebratory” (pp. 30-37), in apparent contrast to the manner typical of the Romans. Machiavelli’s principal values are, in Benner’s estimation, values shared with Greek antiquity. She consequently proposes throughout the book to filter Machiavelli’s moral vocabulary through the ethical framework and language of classical Greece.

If Benner’s account of Machiavelli looks barely recognizable to his present-day casual readers, let alone to recent serious scholars of his thought, she is unconcerned by this. Instead, she points, for precedent, to many members of Machiavelli’s earlier audience — including Gentili, Francis Bacon, Harrington, and Spinoza — to support the position that the Florentine was, first and foremost, a moral philosopher of great power (pp. 2-4). To the extent that she does not offer an extensive examination of why these thinkers found Machiavelli to be worthy of their company, or even of how they themselves conceived the nature of moral philosophy, this assertion smacks of argumentation from authority and thus is unpersuasive. Still, one can perhaps never be reminded too often that Machiavelli has always been read from a variety of perspectives — a historical claim much better documented, for example, in Sydney Anglo’s magisterial 2005 book Machiavelli — The First Century.

I am concerned, however, about Benner’s highly selective and somewhat idiosyncratic use of the large body of more current secondary scholarship on Machiavelli. Much of the literature with which she engages — such as work by Cassirer and Meinecke, and even Strauss, Pocock, and Skinner — while highly influential in the past, is now recognized as being (seriously) deficient or incomplete. Benner’s appeals to these sources give the appearance that she is sparring with straw men in contraposing her own interpretation to that of others — her targets are too easy to knock down. Her lapses in reference to important research of the past thirty or so years are hard to understand: Harvey Mansfield, Sebastian de Grazia, Maurizio Viroli, and Mikael Hörnqvist receive some well-deserved (albeit passing) attention, but many authors included in the bibliography do not seem to have been engaged much (or at all) in the volume. Other important interpreters of the last generation (such as Mark Hulliung and Hanna Pitkin) as well as current ones (for instance, John McCormick’s many articles on Machiavelli’s populism and related topics, Paul Rahe’s Republics — Ancient and Modern, Anthony Parel’s Machiavellian Cosmos, or any of the many relevant papers on Machiavelli by diverse scholars that have appeared in the leading journals History of Political Thought, Journal of the History of Ideas, and Review of Politics) have not merited even bibliographical citation. I am fully aware of the sheer volume of secondary writings on Machiavelli, and it is doubtful any scholar can be held responsible for mastering them completely. Yet the way in which the preceding literature is or is not brought to bear on the arguments of this book has, in my opinion, the effect of distorting the record and, at times, of making Benner’s interpretations appear more innovative or original than they actually are. I do not believe, therefore, that I am quibbling.

A not unrelated objection arises from Benner’s historical claim that Machiavelli’s ethical principles rely upon his understanding and appropriation of Greek sources. The question of the extent of the Florentine’s knowledge of Greek language and of Hellenic and Hellenistic texts (even in Latin or Tuscan translation) is an open one, as she admits. Indeed, her case for the view that Machiavelli was in thrall to the Greeks (presented especially on pp. 9-10) is weak and inferential at best, as her sometimes defensive tone about the topic (see p. 489) seems to reflect. Perhaps more importantly, Benner’s conception of who counts as a member of the “Greek” tradition seems arbitrary: Aristotle is largely shunted aside; nor do I find any mention at all of either Stoicism or Epicureanism, two important and influential schools of Hellenistic philosophy, both in antiquity and in the Renaissance. A different set of choices about which texts and philosophies count as “Greek” would have generated a quite different interpretive scheme. In any case, it does not seem necessary for Benner to rely on the historical argument about the Greek background to Machiavelli in order to sustain her case for the moral precepts guiding his thought, given the considerable weight of the textual evidence from his corpus that she uncovers. Thus, the historical dimension of the book becomes a needless distraction from the defense of her philosophical thesis.

Another concern stems from the hermeneutical premises of Benner’s textual interpretation. She constantly employs an approach that distinguishes “superficial” from “careful” readings and readers, refers at key moments to Machiavelli’s “dissimulation,” and alludes to “clues” and “hints,” as well as to meanings that exist “between the lines” — in sum, she draws on techniques recognizable to scholars of political theory as modes of “esoteric” interpretation (a hermeneutic most closely associated with Leo Strauss and his acolytes). Indeed, Benner admits as much in her conclusion when she “agrees” with Strauss that Machiavelli’s texts "can never simply be taken at face value" (p. 490; emphasis added). Never? Really? And how do we know precisely? The Straussians at least have a highly developed rationale for why political authors must use esoteric means to express themselves, which emerge from the supposedly “dangerous” character of their philosophical truths, if expressed openly, in the context of political power. By contrast, Benner gives us no strong reason to prefer esoteric readings that distort and disfigure the surface meanings of texts in order to point to some deeper truth, except for Machiavelli’s alleged devotion to a Socratic model of philosophical inquiry that is itself imputed and not explicitly on display in his texts. The resulting hermeneutic, not to put too fine a point on it, might best be termed “Strauss lyte.”

One need not hold to a strictly historical interpretive approach of the Cambridge School variety, which insists that the author’s intentions in relation to the ideological and political context are determinative of a text’s meaning, in order to recognize that reasonable standards of historical and intellectual plausibility ought to apply. When, for example, Benner asserts that, despite all of Machiavelli’s praise for Roman republican institutions and “orders,” he “really” rejected the Roman way of life quite thoroughly and profoundly (pp. 475-478), it seems that we have surrendered those reasonable standards. Similarly, while her assertion that Machiavelli might have embraced a view of “conceptions of truth and knowledge that are non-dogmatic and critical, but entail the rejection of extreme skepticism” (p. 126) seems to me to be exegetically plausible, Benner’s assertion depends upon her somewhat tortured understanding of how Machiavelli read the Greek philosophers and historians. A more direct and feasible interpretation would link this view to Cicero’s moderate Academic skepticism, with which the Florentine was doubtless familiar. Cicero is, after all, often mentioned (usually positively) in Machiavelli’s writings (unless, of course, these endorsements were themselves a feint).

In sum, once we are willing to accept that what an author and her/his writings explicitly state is the precise opposite of what is meant, or that their meaning depends upon an unsubstantiated set of intellectual connections, a kind of interpretative anarchism (of the Alice in Wonderland variety) comes to the fore. This is the path down which Benner leads us, and it strikes me that it inherently diverges from her view of Machiavelli as a principled moral individualist of the deontological variety. If she truly believes that Machiavelli’s most cherished doctrines are antithetical to what is stated in his writings, then a single “true” (or even better) reading (the quest for a “core” doctrine in which Benner claims to be engaged) is itself rendered impossible. If there are no criteria for judging between competing readings, because every statement potentially means something else (and who knows which one to take at face value?), then, in words of Cole Porter and Paul Feyerabend, “anything goes” (or, perhaps more aptly, “everything the traffic will allow,” with apologies to Irving Berlin). In fact, I do not think that Benner needed to go down this road at all. Without the “hocus pocus” hermeneutical approach, her book still gives us very good reasons for thinking that Machiavelli may have adopted the kind of ethical individualism that she ascribes to him. The chastened book that would have resulted from a more transparent method of reading would have been less ambitious (i.e., more constrained and limited — and consistent with Machiavelli’s virtue, as Benner understands it), to be sure, but nonetheless compelling and interesting. As it stands, Machiavelli’s Ethics overreaches in far too many directions.