Machiavelli's God

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Maurizio Viroli, Machiavelli's God, Antony Shugaar (tr.), Princeton University Press, 2010, 310pp., $45.00, ISBN 9780691124148.

Reviewed by Laurie M. Johnson Bagby, Kansas State University


Maurizio Viroli, Professor of Politics at Princeton University, is the author of several books about Machiavelli, including, most recently, Niccolo's Smile: A Biography of Machiavelli (2000) and How to Read Machiavelli (2009). This latest book builds on Viroli's considerable scholarship on Machiavelli and the development of republican ideas. In it, Viroli develops the thesis that Machiavelli was not an atheist but a believer in a Christian God who loved virtue, rewarded patriotism, and expected people not to be meek and "turn the other cheek" but to defend their liberty. Aptly entitled Machiavelli's God, this book (nicely translated by Antony Shugaar) not only makes a compelling argument but is a compendium of all that Machiavelli wrote on the subject of religion and all of the most significant primary and secondary literature related to Machiavelli's views on religion. Viroli displays an encyclopedic knowledge of his subject and does so in a way that is not tedious but truly fascinating. His is an indispensible book for anyone who wishes to write about Machiavelli and religion or Machiavelli and republicanism.

There is still, even after reading this book, the nagging question of whether Machiavelli was a true believer, a man of faith, or whether he simply saw the value of religion and its social utility. However, after reading this book, it is difficult to hold the position that Machiavelli was a convinced atheist, or that, if he did see religion as having social utility that he did so cynically and with no real respect for religious beliefs. Viroli's book counters those writers who have viewed Machiavelli as a mere advocate for the use of religion as rhetoric or propaganda. Machiavelli's comments on religion in this volume are enough to cast that cynical view into doubt, and the content of what he says, when considered as a whole, makes such a view of Machiavelli even more doubtful. Viroli himself admits that he does not know exactly what Machiavelli personally thought of God: "I am not entirely sure that I have found that God. I still believe, however, that Machiavelli had a God, and that around this God of his he developed a religion of liberty that played an important historical role in Italian political culture." (ix)

Viroli sets out to show that Machiavelli's preferred religion was a type of Christianity which makes it a duty to love and defend one's liberty. Machiavelli took aim at the interpretation of Christianity as a religion of meekness and acceptance, a religion of fatalism in which everything is left up to God. Machiavelli supported a Christianity like that developed in republican Florence, and of which Fr. Savonarola was emblematic. It was a Christianity that emphasized civic virtue, patriotism, and the willingness to love and defend one's fatherland. According to Viroli, Machiavelli believed in the adage "God helps those who help themselves"

As readers will notice, I claim in this work that Machiavelli not only asserted that republican liberty needs a religion that instills and supports devotion to the common good but also that Christian religion properly interpreted is apt to serve such a civic task. (xi)

Viroli claims that the religion that Machiavelli practiced more than he preached was the religion of working to make "grand ideals" real, to "live for great political and moral ideals in spite of the most disenchanted awareness of the cruelty, misery, and baseness of the human world" (xix). This view of Machiavelli will be surprising enough for some people who see in Machiavelli nothing but a cynical realist. But Viroli is not trying to make him into an idealist, rather, perhaps more of an optimist. Viroli's Machiavelli knew very well the obstacles to virtue posed by human nature and political circumstances, but thought that it was possible to prevail and achieve greatness despite these obstacles. Viroli also claims that the religion that Machiavelli preached was not simply a social tool but something that he thought was of real value to men's souls. If he did not think so, he would not have placed the founders of religion, such as Moses, higher than those who employ religion to achieve particular goals. Though he admired the Romans' use of religion, Machiavelli did not ultimately favor a return to paganism but a renewal of Christianity that promoted the same vigorous love of country found in the ancients. This was, according to Viroli, the same Christianity of virtue -- the civil religion -- that America's founders adopted.

Viroli's extensive use of primary sources brings much credibility to his argument. He thoroughly examines Machiavelli's most important theoretical works and also his letters and diplomatic dispatches. In addition, he carefully explores the religious and political views of Machiavelli's contemporaries, as well as their views about Machiavelli and his writings. Viroli also looks at the reaction to Machiavelli by those political and religious writers who came after him. His examination of Machiavelli's correspondence sheds light on how important the image of God was in his everyday thinking, in a type of writing in which it mattered less how he appeared and where he could be expected to be less careful and more forthright. Viroli shows how Machiavelli's ideas formed in the context of prior philosophers and theologians who had already laid the "foundation for the idea of Christianity as a religion of virtue -- understood, in the manner of the ancients, as strength." (52) He shows how Savonarola's ideas in some ways resonate with Machiavelli's because Savonarola was also preaching a religion of virtue and republicanism. We can see more clearly what Machiavelli intended in his remarks on religion once we really understand the context in which he wrote, not as an isolated individual, but as someone who was refining and redirecting ideas that were already powerful forces behind the events of his time.

Machiavelli does not blame the teachings of Christ for the complacency that threatens republican liberty. He does blame the Church for its interpretation and promotion of a Christianity in which judgment is the responsibility of the Church rather than the people, a Christianity in which earthly glory is incompatible with heavenly glory. On the one hand, the Church is overbearing and wants to rule everything, but on the other it teaches the people to be meek and accepting. Machiavelli claims that the adoption of a virile Christianity is "a return to the true form." (87) Though in some ways Machiavelli's criticisms of the Church would have resonated with adherents of the reformation movement, Machiavelli

knew about Luther and the Lutherans, but that Reformation was different from his approach to reform. He was not interested in indulgences, predestination, divine grace, free will, or the presence of Christ in the Eucharist. He wanted a God who would help the men of his own time, and those of times still to come, to rediscover their love of liberty and the inner strength demanded by a free way of life. (87-88)

If Machiavelli took religion seriously and thought the true Christianity could vigorously support republican liberty, why did he reserve so much praise for someone like Duke Cesare Borgia, whose violence and duplicity Machiavelli made legendary? Viroli shows that Borgia himself thought, and Machiavelli agreed, that God would excuse him. Machiavelli reasoned that God excuses the actions of leaders, taken out of necessity, to secure themselves and their states. (117) If this is true, it is not so much that Machiavelli sequestered political actions from morality, as if politics were in an amoral realm of its own, but rather that he applied the same morality to politics as to every other area of life in which necessity mitigates guilt and justifies otherwise unthinkable actions.

Viroli demonstrates the impact and use of Machiavelli's ideas during the Reformation. Machiavelli's works were a problem for the Catholic Church but sometimes an inspiration for certain reformist elements.

If we are looking for a confirmation of the link in terms of ideas between humanism and the Italian reformation movement, then let us consider the fact that Machiavelli's works, even after they were placed on the Index of Forbidden Books, were present in the libraries of victims of the Inquisition. (226)

But though Machiavelli's criticism of the Catholic Church might have attracted some reformers' attention, Viroli points out that his problems with the Church were not the same as the reformers' problems. Machiavelli had no argument with grandeur and ceremony or anything else that tended to keep the common people in awe and reverence. He was not one to rail against superstition as an evil in itself. He simply did not like the way the Church used its power to encourage passivity and acceptance of what he thought was an unacceptable situation. The Church was not, generally speaking, on the side of liberty or for strong government. Also, the Church's corruption was so open that it could not guarantee the respect of the people, further weakening religion's salutary influence.

Viroli shows this difference between Machiavelli and Reformation thinkers by examining Machiavelli's own writings and also contemporary reactions to Machiavelli's ideas. In fact, there were many different interpretations of Machiavelli's ideas which Viroli thoroughly documents. There were those who agreed with Machiavelli that the current state of the Christian religion not only made people too passive and obedient but too soft and forgiving. There were also those who objected to Machiavelli's view that the Christian religion was compatible with strong government and the pursuit of worldly glory. The Jesuits "accused him of dethroning God and Divine Providence from the government of the affairs of the world, putting in their place an impersonal fate and the inexorable influence of the stars." (240) Freethinkers were attracted to Machiavelli because they saw in his writings the same view of nature as operating free of divine providence, without any deeper meaning than what human beings give it. For others, Machiavelli was a prophet who foretold the coming Reformation upheaval and whose writings help explain why reform was unable to plant deep roots in Italy.

Machiavelli's influence was felt even in the rejection of fascism. For those who see in Machiavelli's writings the roots of that ideology, Viroli's observations are surprising:

The awareness that fascism sank its roots into age-old moral ills, and that a liberation from that regime would only be possible through a moral renewal of the Italians, encouraged the birth of the concept of a 'religion of liberty.' This concept, which more than any other encouraged the moral and political resistance to the Fascist regime, emerged in thoughts about Machiavelli or thoughts that took Machiavelli as a specific point of reference and departure. (286)

One question not answered is how exactly Machiavelli could reconcile the teachings of Christ laid out in the Bible with his preferred Christianity, which did not require leaders to be consistently moral and did not ask people to "turn the other cheek." Viroli is thorough enough that we can say, without much doubt, that Machiavelli never did attempt to do any reconciling on his own. That is, Machiavelli did not directly engage the teachings of Christ in the Gospels and explain why they did not mean what they seem to mean. It would be interesting to see if Viroli could find advocates of virile Christianity who did so.