Machiavelli's Prince: A New Reading

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Erica Benner, Machiavelli's Prince: A New Reading, Oxford University Press, 2013, lv + 343pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199653638.

Reviewed by Ross J. Corbett


In this interpretation of The Prince, Erica Benner further advances the thesis of her previous book, Machiavelli's Ethics (Princeton University Press 2009), in favor of a Machiavelli who is a republican and (more surprisingly) an ethical thinker. She describes The Prince as

a masterwork of ironic writing with a moral purpose. . . . Far from eroding ancient contrasts between good and evil, just and unjust, or tyranny and freedom, Machiavelli's book shows readers the dire consequences that ensue when our language and practices fail clearly to distinguish them. (xxi-xxii)

The "Machiavellianism" that many take to be Machiavelli's advice and praise of nefarious leaders like Cesare Borgia is actually deadpan irony or, in some cases, an initial perspective the limitations of which are revealed dialogically before being abandoned. It is not that Machiavellian principles actually favor republics; it is that Machiavelli did not hew to those principles at all. The Machiavellian republic, Benner argues, realizes "states remain weak and vulnerable so long as they lack orders founded on reciprocal trust between leaders and citizens/subjects, and between states and their external allies" (326). Nor does it need to have recourse to extraordinary princes who return it to its beginnings. Machiavelli longs for a state that is stable, orderly, and just; he wrote The Prince to further that goal.

If such was Machiavelli's teaching, the obvious question is what rhetorical strategy led him to write The Prince. Benner offers several answers. One is that the irony is too outrageous to be missed and was intended as a biting mirror of princes, Machiavelli's praise of various potentates making the wretchedness of the deeds he ascribes to them that much more palpable. Another was a hope to educate his readers on how to avoid being taken in by princes' specious rhetoric by presenting that rhetoric nakedly. Finally, just like Sallust's Cato, Machiavelli avoids making moral arguments to a corrupt people so as not to appear naïve, instead speaking in the corrupt language of self-interest in order to promote the virtues of moderate self-restraint.

Benner quite adeptly teases out the dialogic quality of The Prince, noting that the early chapters abstract entirely from the need to take account of popular sentiment in conducting one's conquests. As the book progresses, however, the need for a prince to be attentive to how the common people view him takes on an ever greater importance, becoming the major theme of the latter half of the book. And because a prince must rely on the people, the advice of the opening chapters cannot be followed at all. Indeed, that advice leads to political disaster. Machiavelli presents it, Benner urges, not as advice, but as a pointer to the importance of the people. Once a prince understands the people and his reliance upon them, moreover, the task of achieving a stable principality stands revealed as impossible. To seek to be a prince is to strive constantly for what cannot be had, a path to frustration at best and spectacular failure at worst. To be a great leader of a republic, on the other hand, is achievable (and one would hope, although Benner's Machiavelli never spells it out, satisfying). Like Xenophon's Simonides, Benner's Machiavelli teaches princes to be kings, not tyrants. One of the best things princes can do to increase their own security is to rely on a citizen militia, a simple military reform with an obvious connection to republican virtue and which requires movement in the direction of republican modes and orders.

Benner makes similar arguments concerning Machiavelli's advice to be cruel rather than merciful, to be faithless, to practice parsimony with one's subjects but to give the property of one's enemies freely, etc. Machiavelli says that combat by means of the law is not always sufficient and so one must have recourse to force, but this is to say that one must sometimes do combat with both law and force, not that one must ever do combat by force alone, Benner argues.

Clearly, a republican reading of The Prince, and especially an ethical one, must be founded on the observation that Machiavelli wrote obscurely, masking his true meaning behind a façade of faithless brutality. Benner does not base her argument entirely on the observation that Machiavelli's Machiavellianism is too outrageous to have been intended seriously, but instead buttresses it with an admirably close reading of the text, paired with an enviable command of the classical sources and contemporary history to which Machiavelli refers. She deploys her scholarship, not in order to situate Machiavelli within his context, but in order to highlight his meaning, revealing what would have been problematic about the text to any reader as educated and worldly as Machiavelli himself. This is no small achievement.

Benner's greatest interpretive innovation does not stem from this close reading alone, however, but from her having identified certain normatively laden code words that color Machiavelli's otherwise deadpan and seemingly neutral depiction of events and counsel. That Machiavelli was ironic and contradicted himself intentionally should be plain to anyone without a tin ear. It is the code words, Benner suggests, that help us know when he is being ironic, and her interpretation of The Prince hinges on them.

The principle animating the code words Benner identifies is that some of them are linked with virtue, some with fortune. To be spoken of in a code word linked with fortune is invariably bad, even if Machiavelli otherwise sounds enthusiastic or impressed. Code words cobbled with virtue, on the other hand, denote praise, "even when they sound low-key or inconspicuous" (liii). Any place that Machiavelli uses the word "turn" (voltare), we should think of "fortune's destabilizing vicissitudes in principalities" (24n2). "Whenever he says that gains are made 'quickly' (subito) or easily (facilmente), this is always code for unstable and easily lost" (36). It is not good to be called "happy" by Machiavelli, it being "one of Machiavelli's strongest code words for [a] deceptively pleasant but dangerous reliance on fortune" (76). Benner prefixes her book with a helpful list of code words (liii). "Low" always connotes praise, while "high," "rare," and "great" always imply criticism, or at least sound a warning. "Caution," "respect," "stable," "ordinary," and "order" always have an echo of "virtue," while both "spirited" and "idle" join "impetuosity," "innovate," "variation," and "extraordinary" in the fortune-linked column.

In line with this schema, principality is not simply rule by one man, as though Machiavelli had collapsed kingship and tyranny in Aristotle's sixfold scheme of regimes, but a state in which the ruling part shares a prince's desire to rule alone. Thus, "principality" includes both democracies and aristocracies, since "the basic ordering principle of [each], like that of principalities, is the dominance of one part over the others rather than shared power" (12). "Prince" and "principality" are fortune-linked code words, implying criticism wherever they appear, while "republic" is linked to virtue.

The test of such a thesis must of course involve examining Machiavelli's use of these code words, too great an endeavor for a book review. I focused on one while reading Benner's book. "In Machiavelli's lexicon," Benner states,

ordinario does not mean 'average' or commonplace. Actions done 'ordinarily' are actions that build, reinforce, or adhere to basic 'orders' (ordini) in a state, or in human life generally. . . . If ordinario modes cause order, estraordinario ones go against, erode, or destroy it. (26)

On the very next page, in order to support this conjecture, she remarks,

In chapter 3, 'ordinary' is paired with the words natural (naturale), reasonable (ragionevole), and necessary (necessario). It refers as much to the general 'order' of human nature as to man-made political orders. The desire to acquire is 'very natural and ordinary'; it is a 'natural and ordinary necessity' that new princes must offend someone; and it is no miracle but 'ordinary and reasonable' that those who fail to act prudently always lose what they acquire. In all these instances, the word 'ordinary does not just mean 'normal', but 'compatible with good human orders. (27)

She draws from ordinary's coded meaning the teaching that hereditary princes, who are said to be able to preserve themselves with "ordinary industry" so long as they lack "extraordinary vices," must work hard to promote good orders if they are to maintain their states.

It is exceedingly difficult to accommodate the passages just quoted to Benner's understanding of ordinary. On the contrary, ordinary seems to mean exactly commonplace in these instances, it being contrasted with the miraculous or unexpected. Similarly, when Machiavelli says that mercenary captains who are not virtuous ruin you "in the ordinary way" (Prince XII), he cannot reasonably be taken to mean that mediocre military commanders ruin cities in a way favorable to good orders.

It would cut against Benner's entire thesis, moreover, to say that the desire to acquire and the necessity to offend someone that this desire occasions is compatible with good orders. Benner responds that, "while the necessity to offend is a natural and ordinary consequence of becoming a new prince, the wish to be or to create a new prince is not itself natural, ordinary, or necessary" (33). This response means, however, that ordinary is not a code word that always denotes praise (aside from the fact that, if the desire to acquire is natural and ordinary, it would seem that Benner is wrong that the desire to acquire a principality is not natural and ordinary).

"Ordinary" is also conspicuously absent where Benner's code-word hypothesis would predict it ought to be. Machiavelli says it would have been "reasonable" for those conquered by Alexander the Great to rebel upon his death, but for the fact that they lacked the virtue of free peoples -- a statement such as this would be a perfect place for Machiavelli to have said that it would have been reasonable and ordinary for them to rebel, if he had made a conscious decision to link ordinary with the establishment or defense of good orders. Benner glosses Machiavelli's argument that the conqueror of free cities must ruin them, saying, "Resistance to those who take away a city's freedom to live under its own laws, choose its own government, and determine its own external policies is, it seems, the reasonable and ordinario reaction of its citizens" (63). Benner's hypothesis does predict the presence of ordinario here, but that is Benner's ordinario: Machiavelli says no such thing, Benner's having given it in the original Italian notwithstanding. She does the same thing (this time putting the English word in quotation marks) in arguing that Machiavelli's description of Hiero's deeds (which she sees as more flattering than the description of Moses', Theseus', Cyrus', and Romulus' actions, inverting the nominally higher praise given to those founder-prophets) "ennobles the 'ordinary', unremarkable-looking qualities that create and maintain good orders" (87). Machiavelli does not call Hiero's qualities "ordinary." And again, one with a civil principality will be checked by the magistrates whose existence masks that the republic has been replaced with the rule of its first citizen, and "Growing wary of these 'ordinary' restraints on his authority, he is apt to turn towards the other, personal method of command and seek more 'absolute authority'" (133). Machiavelli does not call anything "ordinary" in the chapter on civil principalities.

Nor does Benner apply her code when it no longer supports her interpretation. She does not explain how prince can always connote blame if Philopoemen was called "prince of the Achaeans," saying only that he wasn't really that kind of prince (173). When a virtue-linked word is used with regard to Agathocles, she concludes that Machiavelli must have used his own secret code ironically (57n4).

A code that cannot be relied upon is not a code, however. Benner seems to recognize this when making claims about the code, saying that the presence of a fortune-linked word is enough to cast aspersion and that this or that word "always" has a certain connotation. If we must determine on our own whether a code word carries its coded meaning, it seems that the code becomes merely an expression of our intuited sense of what Machiavelli must mean rather than a rod that corrects our interpretation when it strays from Machiavelli's sense or a key that unlocks it.

Benner's code, moreover, seems to force Machiavelli's meaning to conform to her view of what an ethical teaching would be. If any praise of a prince for "greatness" is always a criticism, it is impossible that any writer to whom such a code is applied could ever be an advocate for anything other than the humble. Benner cannot disprove other scholars whose interpretations of Machiavelli include room for the extraordinary within republican governments if the only way to understand Machiavelli is to start with the presumption that every mention of "extraordinary" conveys a defect. Noting that Machiavelli does not ask whether the aim of Alexander VI to make his son powerful was reasonable, Benner concludes that Machiavelli must have judged it unreasonable because the means to that end involved upsetting existing orders and bringing "disorder" to Italian states, terms she knows carry normative baggage (98).

Leaving the code aside, there is something paradoxical about a crypto-ethical Machiavelli. As to any educative purpose Machiavelli's rhetoric might have had, one marvels at the idea that a message concealed behind classical allusions, intentional errors of history, and the tangled maze of contradictory statements in which Benner recognizes The Prince abounds would have a more wide-ranging and powerful impact than the surface text. One can be veiled, ironic, esoteric, reticent, or contradictory about one's motives, but one cannot fail to be forthright about one's counsel if one expects to be heeded.

Leaving aside the question of whether it would have been sensible for Machiavelli to pursue the rhetorical strategy imputed to him by Benner if he really did wish to vindicate morality, there is still the question of what it would mean for Machiavelli to be an ethical thinker. Benner says very little about the need to eliminate an old prince's bloodline, other than that Machiavelli occasionally adopts a more republican, less princely perspective (36-37). This does not tell us, however, whether newly founded or recovered republics must also eliminate the bloodlines of those princes who previously ruled over their cities. Does Machiavelli's being an ethical thinker help us to determine what he thought was and was not necessary for the establishment and maintenance of a stable polity? Or does it mean that Machiavelli dispensed practical advice (however furtively) without considering its practicability?

One wonders whether Benner would recognize those who fundamentally disagree with her about ethics as ethical. Her comparison of Machiavelli to Sallust's Cato's speaking to a corrupted people implies that Machiavelli conceived of what was said about ethics as either corrupted or uncorrupted, that is, not as reflective of different conceptions of what it means to be good. Benner claims that Machiavelli sought to renew "traditional morality" (195).

There is, however, no such thing. The status of pietà differentiates Christian virtue from that of the Roman Seneca upon whom she relies in saying that the title of Chapter XVII contains the names of two vices (199-201). Nor is there such a thing as "ancient virtue," or to say that one longs for the return of ancient virtue does not specify that for the return of which one longs: Homeric virtue is that not of the Aristotelian gentleman, and neither of these was identical with Stoicism, itself a sect attempting to clarify and give voice to (and thus not simply identical with) Roman virtue.

What hints Benner does drop about what an unethical Machiavelli would look like, moreover, place much "traditional morality" in the unethical pile. She denies that Machiavelli held a "pragmatically amoral view," where respect for security, freedom, and transparency were good only most of the time (326). We can discern Machiavelli's judgment of the ends pursued by Alexander VI from the fact that his means involved disorder (98). Such a conclusion is possible only if necessity never confronts us with hard choices, the disordering of others never being forced upon us if we do not ourselves have unethical goals.

Machiavelli's ethical republicanism as Benner presents it seems built on a model of sin rather than vice in its intransigence, but with bare political non-domination as its only content. Adherence to this ethical code is unproblematic, requiring only the abandonment of greatness, of the rare, of the high. It is susceptible to an easy good/bad, virtue/fortune, ordinary/extraordinary dichotomy. Principality is not contrasted with rule devoted to the common good, but with "shared power" (cf. 12). Being a republican, predictably, does not mean contesting the content of the common good and agitating for different regimes that reflect different conceptions of the best way of life for all and which way of life is most choiceworthy for human beings in common and individually. Considerations of what it means to be a good citizen certainly do not lead to an abandonment of the city or a disenchantment with it, to reflections that lead to the City of God and philosophic friendship, as well as to the excesses of Alcibiades. If Machiavelli's corruption of morality consists in an unjustified truncating of moral thought for the sake of political expediency, even understood as involving a significant element of stability, an ethical republicanism such as this does not answer the charge actually leveled against him.

Ultimately, Benner's book provides a great service to Machiavelli scholars, regardless of whether they agree with its primary thesis. Machiavelli's text is glaringly outrageous, and much of its subtlety (and hence irony) can be lost in that glare. Because of her close reading and erudition, Benner points out much that is questionable in The Prince that could otherwise be missed (and which many scholars have missed). As such, Benner makes for an excellent interlocutor with whom to disagree.