Macroscopic Metaphysics: Middle-Sized Objects and Longish Processes

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Paul Needham, Macroscopic Metaphysics: Middle-Sized Objects and Longish Processes, Springer, 2017, 224 pp., $109.99, ISBN 9783319709987.

Reviewed by Harold Noonan, University of Nottingham


This is an excellent book, hugely well-informed about its subject matter and taking a strongly independent line on issues at the heart of much contemporary metaphysics. If you have thought about the puzzle of the statue and the clay, the nature of constitution and its relation to identity, whether it is a necessary a posteriori truth that water is H2O, or maybe even an essential truth, this book is for you. Standard views are analysed and challenged against the background of an informed discussion of present-day chemistry and its history. The focus on chemistry is probably the most notable feature of the book, and it is clearly Paul Needham's opinion that contemporary metaphysical debates about his topics have no significance unless backed up by knowledge of its results.

The topic of the book is matter. The concept in question is our ordinary concept of matter insofar as this involves our talk of ordinary continuants (contrast: occurrences or processes) and concerns the macroscopic realm of middle-sized objects, hence the title. The emphasis is on science rather than philosophical intuition, but as noted above, the science in question is chemistry rather than physics. Needham writes that, insofar as science bears, it is the everyday science of macroscopic objects, not the 'exotic sciences' that are of principal concern to philosophers of physics.

So the book has a slightly old-fashioned air. In fact, Needham describes it as an essay in 'descriptive metaphysics', harking back to Strawson, but explaining the difference that the aim is to describe 'the structure of our scientific thought about the actual world' rather than 'the actual structure of our thought about the world'.

The book takes a historic approach in the middle, looking at the development of scientific thought about chemical substance going back to Aristotle and the Stoics. But the aim is critical; it is to redress the neglect, by the linguistic philosophy that has dominated recent discussions of mass terms, of the scientifically important concepts.

Needham rather sharply insists that he will not enter the realm of metaphysical possibility or engage with philosophical speculations abut individual essences and underlying natures. Mereology is a key tool and much emphasis is put on the point that it is classical mereology, with the usual dyadic relations, that is being employed. To avoid relativizing mereological concepts to time, a distinction is drawn between quantities of matter, which are mereologically constant, and individuals constituted of such quantities. So, constitution and its familiar puzzles are a theme.

The book has nine chapters, an Appendix summarizing the principles introduced and a glossary of symbols used in the formal statement of principles.

Chapter One, 'Mereology', outlines classical mereology, and makes the crucial distinction between quantities, to which mereological principles apply, and individuals (everyday material objects), to which they do not. The constitution relation and reasons for resisting classical mereological principles to account for change over time are explained. The chapter ends with a useful summary of what will follow.

Chapter Two, 'Occupying Space', introduces the second relation, other than constitution, crucial to Needham scheme. This is the occupies relation, a triadic relation between material bodies, regions of space and intervals of time. The most important point emphasized is that individuals and the quantities of matter that constitute them do not in general occupy the same regions as the quantities of matter constituting them. So, quantities of matter must be distinct from the individuals they constitute.

Chapter Three, 'Constitution', focuses on this relation, distinguishing it from parthood and defining it as a triadic relation between a quantity of matter, an individual and a time. The discussion is critical, engaging with David Wiggins, Ted Sider, Denis Robinson, Peter Simons, Katherine Hawley and Peter van Inwagen. There is, in particular, an Appendix, attacking van Inwagen's understanding of parthood as time-dependent. A section on modality discusses the thesis that constitution is identity and the appeal to the familiar case of the all-time-coincident statue and piece of clay (ascribed, oddly, to Hawley rather than Alan Gibbard). The example is dismissed on the ground that it is fantastic and so it is difficult to see what bearing it could have on the character of ordinary objects. Saul Kripke's necessity of origin thesis is discussed and endorsed at least for some individuals.

The next four chapters discuss the features of quantities of matter, distinguished from individuals.  'Distributivity and Cumulativity' is concerned with the familiar distinction between mass and count nouns and how to get it straight. Quine is appealed to. 'The Ancients' Ideas of Substance', returns us to Aristotle and the Stoics. The next chapter, 'The Nature of Matter', takes us forward to the Enlightenment and beyond and focuses on the recognition of the distinction between substance and phase and the realisation that water is not necessarily liquid.

The next chapter, 'The Relation of Macroscopic Description to Microstructure', takes as an example the familiar claim 'Water is H2O'. It emphasizes that this cannot be construed as a claim about the constitution of water at the microlevel but is a purely macroscopic claim about the composition of water. 'Water' and 'H2O' are dyadic predicates of quantities and times, and 'Water is H2O' means that the two predicates apply to the same things at the same time. Detailed chemical knowledge is brought to bear on Quine's views on the distributivity of mass nouns. But what the reader might have expected at this point--a discussion of Kripke's views on the status of 'Water is H2O' as an identity statement between rigid designators, akin to 'Hesperus is Phosphorus', and its modal and epistemic status--is not present. 'Water is H2O' is returned to in a later chapter. However, the upshot of the account sketched above is pretty clearly that it should not be thought of, at least not primarily, as Kripke would have it, as an identity statement between kinds. So perhaps the questions about its modal and epistemic status as such are thought to be moot. The chapter ends with a discussion of indiscernible particles drawing on Steven French and Dècio Krause.

Chapter Eight, 'Longish Processes', turns from continuants to occurrents. They are distinguished from continuants and not reducible to them; nor are continuants thought to be reducible to occurrents. Occurrents are understood as temporally extended processes, with temporal parts. Mereological essentialism for processes is defended. There is no possibility of a particular process being longer or shorter than it is.

The next chapter, 'Modal Properties of Quantities', takes up questions of modality again, this time with respect to quantities rather than individuals or processes. Here we return to the topic of 'Water is H2O' and a discussion of its modal status. The initial point of the chapter is to dismiss the talk of essences associated with talk of metaphysical necessity. Hale is referred to as proposing an essentialist theory of necessity, but Needham's conclusion is that he sees no need to strive after the distinction and 'necessarily and 'essentially' are used interchangeably. The topic of the status of 'Water is H2O' is taken up again after a chemically informed discussion of the distinction between elements and compounds. The claim that it is necessary that water is H2O is accepted as the necessitation of a universal condition asserting that any quantity which at a time is water is at that time H2O. But there is no appeal to the idea of identity or, a fortiori, the thesis that an identity statement between rigid designators is, if true, necessarily true. It is argued that any quantity which happens to be water at a time is not necessarily water at that time (or any other) and so water is not necessarily H2O in the sense that any quantity which is at any time water is necessarily at that time water (H2O). The epistemic status of the example is not discussed. The chapter then proceeds to a discussion of possible states and possible processes, arguing the need to express claims difficult to capture with conventional sentential modal operators.

The chapter ends with a statement indicating the distance the author finds himself to be from much contemporary discussion of these issues:

For the world's matter to assemble in such a way as to create a golden mountain or for Descartes' left leg . . . to be annihilated is to stretch the notion of possibility beyond . . . plausibility. These . . . circumstances . . . call for possible worlds accessible from one to another by something more closely resembling a leap of faith than a physical process. (p. 199)

I will end by returning to the topic of the statue and the clay. Needham describes Hawley's example of the all-time-coincident statue and piece of clay as too fantastical to have any bearing on any useful thought about ordinary objects and so does not see a need to discuss the issues arising. But the issues do not go away and are particularly relevant to his final discussion. The statue and the clay puzzle provides Lewis, independently of his more general modal realism, with an argument for a counterpart theory of modality. Opponents of his 'constitution is identity' view need to provide a different account of modal predication and explain away the intuition that only one thing is present. Needham's discussion of the Lewisian account and the challenge it presents to his own position would have been illuminating. So, while Needham takes on many of the obvious opponents to his view, the discussion in this respect seemed disappointingly incomplete.

That said, to repeat, this is an excellent book, enormously informative and absorbing (though not an easy read). It certainly should be on the reading list of anyone interested in anything related to macroscopic metaphysics.