Made with Words: Hobbes on Language, Mind, and Politics

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Philip Pettit, Made with Words: Hobbes on Language, Mind, and Politics, Princeton University Press, 2008, 183pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691129297.

Reviewed by Alan Nelson and Matthew Priselac, University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill


This book is about Hobbes's science of politics in the context of his materialistic theory of nature, including human nature. The focus is on Hobbes's definitive presentation of his system in Leviathan, but Pettit frequently cites other writings too. In Leviathan, Hobbes defined 'science' as the knowledge of the consequences of well chosen definitions. 'Politics', then, is the science of "politic bodies" that are constituted by humans. The first of Leviathan's four parts is accordingly devoted to Hobbes's science of the human being. The second part, "Of Commonwealth", is carefully based on the first. Books about Hobbes's philosophy typically acknowledge this by emphasizing the centrality of self-interest in the Hobbesian human being, but little connection has been made between the specific theories of biology and psychology found in Part I and the politics in Part II. It has fallen to Pettit to interpret Hobbes's politics as firmly and systematically rooted in the science of the human being. In Made with Words the task is brilliantly executed.

Pettit develops an interpretation of Hobbes that places the influence of language at the center of his philosophy. For Pettit's Hobbes the whole of human life -- the mental, social, and political -- is built from matter with the addition of language. This much is fairly close to the surface of the texts; Pettit's novel interpretive claim is that once we have the basic material mind, each further step is made possible by, and crucially depends on, language. The first two chapters offer an interpretation of what Pettit takes to be Hobbes's two step account of the human mind. First, the mind common to humans and animals -- the natural mind -- is located in matter; second, the distinctly human mind -- marked by its capacity for general and active thought -- emerges from the natural mind through the addition of language.

The natural mind is in the business of prudently navigating its environment. Such navigation has two components: forming reliable expectations, and being motivated to prudently act on such expectations. Pettit's interpretive thesis here is that once we have the material natural mind, the addition of language yields the fully human mind by extending these two aspects of the natural mind. Language extends the scope of cognition from particular to general thought and the scope of motivation from bodily to mental activity.

Cognition begins with sensation, which is the motion objects create within the body by impinging on its sense organs. Motion, however, does not cease until the moving parts are acted upon, so the motion generated by the object remains even after an object ceases to impinge on the senses. Hobbes calls the remaining motion the thought of the object. Hobbes's natural mind is also sensitive to certain relations between motions of the mind including their order in sensation -- what Hobbes calls trains of thought -- and their similarity. Pettit cites Hobbes's Elements of Law to show how sense, thoughts and sensitivity to sequence and similarity allow the natural mind to form reliable expectations: "after man hath been accustomed to see like antecedents followed by like consequents, whensoever he seeth the like come to pass to any thing he had seen before, he looks there should follow it the same that followed then" (EL 4.7). Sensation of an object leads to thoughts of similar objects, which bring in train thoughts of the objects sensed subsequently to them. So long as there is regularity in the world, that is, so long as similar antecedents are followed by similar consequents in the world, the natural mind's expectations -- the thoughts brought in train -- will be reliable guides to the future. The natural mind, the reliable navigator, is guided by thoughts of particulars to other thoughts of particulars, never directing its own thought or thinking generally.

The natural mind begins its ascent to general and active thought through speech, that is, by naming objects. Language, on Pettit's interpretation, allows for general thought to emerge from the natural mind through the natural mind's ability to register similarity: "introduced to a name that is meant to apply to many things, and presented with some putative examples, I may find it natural to extend the name to things in a certain range and deny it to others" (34). Certain objects are similar to the introductory examples, others aren't. Based on our sensitivity to various similarities and differences we acquire many general terms for collections of similar objects. As Pettit recognizes, however, for his interpretation to succeed (or at least not open Hobbes to a charge of obvious circularity) it cannot be that the way in which the natural mind registers similarity is the same as the grasp on similarity afforded by language. At the heart of Pettit's interpretation of Hobbes's material mind, then, is a distinction between two ways in which similarity manifests itself in the mind. Pettit describes the difference as follows:

When a similarity operates on us in a subliminal way, after the fashion of natural minds, it does not enable us to form a conception of the background property and does not put us in a position to consult it … That changes only when we gain access to words and can bring to light the properties that were previously hidden. (36)

The viability of Pettit's interpretation therefore hinges on finding these two manifestations of similarity in the Hobbesian mind constituted solely by sense, thought and trains of thought.

Pettit offers a straightforward interpretation of the natural mind's registering of similarity: "But how is the likeness to register, under the particularistic image of the natural mind? I can now provide an answer: because it registers in a subliminal way that cues the subject's expectations about what will happen in the later case" (35). The natural mind's registering of similarity consists merely in a certain pattern of thought of particular objects and so while this pattern allows for language acquisition it does not yet amount to thinking generally. The pressing interpretive question, therefore, is: what is it for the Hobbesian mind to conceive a similarity, to have that similarity 'brought to light.' How is this achieved through words? Pettit is less explicit on this front.

An important constraint on answering this interpretive question is provided by Leviathan 3.11, "besides sense, and thoughts, and the train of thoughts the mind of man has no other motion." Respecting this text seems to require that the worded manifestation of similarity consists only in having the common term in mind -- by naming each object in the class, the term stands for (represents) the similarity by which they are grouped. General thought is then straightforwardly dependent on language: it is by thinking words that we think generally, that is, represent a collection defining similarity; general thought is constituted by worded thought. Another approach to how language might allow for general thought is that it allows for a new mental ability to isolate in thought, to directly grasp in thought, the similarity that the natural mind responds to in grouping objects as it does. By having a general term for a class of objects we are led to grasp that by which the objects are grouped, to grasp the basis of the grouping. That is, the similarity is 'brought to light' by the word, but its being brought to light is distinct from thinking the word. This interpretive approach, however, seems to stray from L 3.11 in that such a grasp does not seem to fit into the exhaustive mental inventory given in 3.11. Because Pettit does not explicitly take this last step in explaining the worded manifestation of similarity in the mind, there sometimes seems to be a gap between the resources his interpretation offers Hobbes in accounting for general thought and what he takes Hobbes's account of general thought to deliver. On the one hand, the passages cited above from Pettit suggest that he takes general thought to be distinct from but facilitated by worded thought. On the other hand, Pettit's interpretative project seems committed to adhering to L 3.11 and so taking worded thought to constitute general thought. Explicitly addressing worded similarity could help to close this gap and answer an important question for his interpretation.

Having offered an interpretation of Hobbes in which distinctly human thought depends on language, Pettit proceeds to examine how two phenomena associated with mentality, reasoning (Chapter 3) and personhood (Chapter 4), similarly depend on language for Hobbes. The third chapter's central point is that reason depends on language in that reasoning is reckoning with sequences of words. Affirming and denying is a matter of adding and subtracting the relevant terms' extensions. Whether some affirmation or denial follows from some others depends on whether the resulting extensions line up. Since mind and reason are not distinct metaphysical entities or faculties, persons cannot be identified as centers of thought or reasoning. Hobbesian personhood, Pettit shows, is not a concept of a metaphysical kind but rather of a role. Persons are things that give and take commitments on behalf of either themselves or others. Personhood depends on language since language is the medium in which the personhood role is fulfilled. It is that by which we verbally give and take commitments.

The creation of persons or "personating" is crucial in Pettit's reconstruction and making it so is one of his principal insights. In Leviathan, Hobbes tucked the material into Chapter 16 after the showy chapters describing the state of nature, the laws of nature, and the mechanism of contracting. This expository indiscretion might explain why so many have overlooked what Pettit has seen. Hobbes's definition of a natural person as one who represents oneself with speech is connected with his understanding of contract. Breaking a contract when the other party is expected to perform is irrational because it amounts to a kind of contradiction. More specifically, Hobbes might say that representing oneself as contracting and then not performing accordingly is to represent oneself as both p and not-p thus negating one's personhood. Such a course of action can nevertheless be advantageous if one is not assured of the other party's performance. This leads to the distinctively Hobbesian requirement of a sovereign enforcement agency.

The contract that results in a commonwealth and a sovereign is based on the definition of an artificial person. An artificial person is produced when one speaks for another. A speaker might personate another human being, or even an inanimate object. One example Hobbes gives is a rector personating a church. Moreover, a speaker can authorize another to represent or personate him. A commonwealth is attained, therefore, when everyone in a group authorizes a single agent to personate him. The result is a single artificial person with the sovereign speaking for the rest as the head of the corporate body -- a favorite metaphor of Hobbes's. With a sovereign assuring the keeping of contracts, it becomes unconditionally irrational to break them. It is, moreover, irrational to violate any civil law published by the sovereign. This is because each citizen (or better, "subject") endorses the laws by having authorized his personation by the sovereign. When publishing and then interpreting civil laws, the sovereign speaks for everyone. There is the familiar exception for circumstances that directly threaten the life of the subject. The reason is that it would be self-abnegation to act or use one's own voice to bring about one's own demise, so the same is true of an authorized personator.

The role of the sovereign is to protect the subjects and promote peace. Language is again at the crux of the matter. In the state of nature, war can be seen as a result of linguistic cogitation. Humans are capable of detailed reasoning about their future welfare and this enhances their appetite for power. Each understands the extensions of the terms 'good' and 'bad' indexically, as good and bad for herself, and strives to increase her power to attain this good and avoid this bad. Conflict is the natural result. By laying down civil laws, the sovereign establishes fixed, interpersonal significations for such terms as 'justice' thereby greatly facilitating cooperation. "It establishes an order of public meanings in an area where such an order is not spontaneously available, restoring the power of words to provide people with common bearings and shared reasons" (132).

The book is mostly devoted to understanding Hobbes's philosophy, but Pettit does sometimes offer criticisms that are more or less internal to Hobbes's project. One recurring objection lodged by Pettit concerns Hobbes's use or misuse of definition. Hobbes understood science to depend on precise, ultimately empirical definitions. Thus,

He could claim the high methodological ground, while practicing the well-honed skills of an orator while doing battle with his many enemies. He could denounce rhetoric in his opponents, while using one of the most powerful tools of rhetoric under the guise of scientific orthodoxy. (54)

The most egregious example of this, according to Pettit, involves the words 'freedom' and 'liberty.' Hobbes's highly reductive senses of these terms (finely analyzed by Pettit in Chapter 8) are jarring to most of his attentive readers. Hobbes's claim that the subjects of the sovereign enjoy extensive freedom takes on the appearance of a "rigged job" (140). Hobbes's position here is, perhaps, more subtle than Pettit allows. Hobbes wants his definitions to track ordinary use as much as possible, but the qualification is important. Ordinary use of important terms will be equivocal, so Hobbes naturally needs to standardize the core of common use and discard the rest. The test of the definitions is their having the correct empirical consequences. To make what Hobbes would have to recognize as a strong opposing case, his opponents would need to provide competing definitions whose component terms all had appropriate materialist, empirical credentials. That burden will be rejected by most of Hobbes's opponents more because of the materialism than because of the call for precise definitions.

Made with Words is clearly written, thoroughly researched, historically sensitive, yet philosophically acute. Hobbes is not presented as clumsily reaching for anachronistic formalisms, nor is his system colored by a hankering for some kind of non-natural normativity or intentionality. Pettit's Hobbes speaks with his own voice only with more rigor and perspicacity. The interpretation is original and stimulating, yet fully accessible to strong undergraduate students. It is remarkable that this package is delivered in under two hundred pages, thirteen of which are devoted to a concluding chapter-by-chapter summary so useful that reviewers must work hard not to make extensive use of it. Everyone interested in seventeenth-century philosophy or political philosophy should read this important book.