Madness: A Philosophical Exploration

Garson Madness

Justin Garson, Madness: A Philosophical Exploration, Oxford University Press, 2022, 304pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197613832.

Reviewed by Şerife Tekin, University of Texas at San Antonio


Justin Garson’s Madness: A Philosophical Exploration offers a conception of madness that infuses hope to those whose lives are touched by it. Moving away from the construal of madness-as-dysfunction, the dominant framework in contemporary mental illness research and treatment, Garson argues that we can and should see madness as a designed feature, just like the heart or the lungs. According to the madness-as-dysfunction view, mental illness occurs when the mind or the brain does not function in the way nature intended. In contrast, in the madness-as-strategy view, when someone is mad, their mind or their brain is working exactly as it was designed. Moreover, madness can sometimes be cathartic, healing, and consoling, providing “strategies for solving problems, coping with aspects of the environment, regulating one’s mental economy” (Garson 2022, 10). By successfully marshalling the tools of philosophy, psychiatry, and history, Garson offers new conceptual resources for making sense of madness and loosens the grip of the madness-as-dysfunction model in contemporary psychiatry.

What is most remarkable in Garson’s analysis is his skillful showcasing of the co-existence of madness-as-strategy and madness-as-dysfunction views since Classical Antiquity. Madness offers a fresh alternative to approaches that differentiate madness-as-dysfunction and madness-as-strategy views on the basis of mind-body dualism or biomedical vs. psychological approaches to mental illness. Garson argues the madness-as-strategy model has always co-existed with the madness-as-dysfunction model in both the scientific and the lay consciousness, but the former has always been marginalized and at times rendered invisible. He unpacks the co-existence of these two traditions through a rigorous historical and philosophical analysis.

In Part 1, “The Dual Teleology of Madness,” Garson sets the stage by challenging a prevalent reading of the history of Western medicine in the Hippocratic era, namely that Hippocratic physicians represent a naturalistic approach to disease, separating the workings of the body from the gods, whereas Greek magicians represent a supernatural view of disease. Garson challenges this script by arguing Hippocratic physicians viewed madness as a dysfunction, a breakdown of a mechanism, while Greek magicians took madness to be a strategy. In other words, for the Hippocratic physician, disease is a violation of teleology; it prevents the organism from fulfilling its function. Meanwhile, according to the magician, disease serves a purpose, and this purpose is “divine retribution,” i.e., a penalty for offending the gods. In Garson’s reading, Hippocratic physicians were not attempting to remove supernatural forces such as gods and religion from accounts striving to make sense of the disease but rather to distance themselves from magical thinking. By the Middle Ages, madness-as-strategy was Christianized, Garson argues, with magicians replaced by the “exorcists, the witch-hunters, the papists” (ibid., 28) who sought to remove the disease by discerning which devil was implicated in a patient’s complaint. This means that, with the view of the Christian God as caring and concerned for the morality of humans (unlike the non-interventionist Greek gods), madness obtains a dual teleology: it is at once a punishment and a salvation for the individual. Madness serves to punish but with the goal of purification in mind.

Part II, “Madness and the Sound Mind,” explores the evolution of the strong grip of the madness-as-dysfunction view through a rigorous study of influential figures such as Immanuel Kant, John Locke, John Haslam, Philippe Pinel, Wilhelm Griesinger, and Emil Kraepelin. Briefly stated, Kant’s “Essay on the Maladies of the Head” is an embodiment of the madness-as-dysfunction view, as Kant treats different types of madness as keyed to different faculties of the mind. For example, dementia is an aberration of judgment, and insanity is an aberration of reason. Yet Garson argues that we see grains of the madness-as-strategy approach in Kant when he writes about there being a method in madness, the mind of the mad person still organizes itself into a system rather than remaining in complete disarray. But this is only a hint. Kant agreed with his contemporaries who endorsed the madness-as-dysfunction view that the goal of the healer is to diagnose the part of the mind that has stopped working and to fix it. In this construal, the mad person has no say and cannot make a contribution to recovery; those who are mad must wait passively to be fixed by those who heal. In Locke’s view, madness is emergent when faculties of the mind are defective; the mad person has the faculty of reason but makes flawed inferences. In the 19th century, Philippe Pinel, in Kantian fashion, took madness to be a breakdown in the faculties of the mind. In Pinel, just as in Kant, there are signs of a madness-as-strategy approach. For instance, delusions have a healing function as they serve to fulfil the mad person’s wishes. Finally, in the early 20th century, we get close to the contemporary version of the madness-as-dysfunction hypothesis with Emil Kraepelin’s Clinical Psychiatry: A Textbook for Students and Physicians (1902), which Garson describes as the “biologization of Kant.” With Kraepelin, all ideas of purposiveness and goal-directedness are removed from instances of genuine madness.

In the last part of the book, “Madness and the Goal of Evolution,” Garson brings us to the contemporary era, rightly noting that this period has witnessed madness-as-dysfunction and madness-as-strategy views sitting in an “awkward proximity” (ibid., 175). Freudian psychoanalysis dominated early 20th century scientific and social consciousness, representing the ascendance of the madness-as-strategy view. According to Freud, madness is functional; it provides a strategy for fulfilling unconscious wishes. Even the first two editions of the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders (DSM), the primary document that classifies mental disorders, widely used in North America and around the world, proposed a psychoanalytic approach that construed mental disorders as “reactions.” Madness-as-dysfunction developed into its current shape starting with the publication of the third edition of the DSM (DSM-III), which construed mental disorders as behavioral, psychological, or biological dysfunctions.

What is particularly compelling in this section of the book is Garson’s observation that the shift between the DSM-II and DSM-III was not a move away from psychological to biological approaches in understanding mental disorders, as some have argued, but one from the madness-as-strategy to the madness-as-dysfunction view. The madness-as-dysfunction approach later appeared in the National Institute of Mental Health’s Research Domain Criteria (RDoC), a research framework for the investigation of mental disorders. Despite it being dubbed a “paradigm shift in psychiatry” (e.g., Insel et al 2010), Garson argues, following other critics (e.g., Bluhm 2017),  that RDoC embodies the madness-as-dysfunction view as it takes mental disorders to be disorders of brain circuits. At the end of the 20th century, madness-as-strategy once again returned to mental disorder research, with the influence of Darwinian medicine, and mental illnesses such as depression or anxiety disorders were depicted as “adaptations, as having evolved purposes, as having been designed by natural selection to cope with Pleistocene existence” (ibid., 175).

Garson’s analysis of the dynamic terrain between proponents of madness-as-dysfunction and proponents of madness-as-strategy is not just an interesting intellectual exercise. There are multiple pragmatic consequences of this “recovery operation”—taking madness-as-strategy out of hiding and putting it at the center of contemporary styles of thinking about madness. For example, Garson argues madness-as-strategy offers an “intellectual scaffolding” for the Mad Pride Movement, Mad resistance, or Mad activism (ibid., 12). As Garson eloquently puts, if you think that “your illness, or even an aspect of it, is an adaptive, purposeful or goal-directed response to a problem,” you are “less likely to attack it as if it is the problem itself” (ibid., 12). This idea is both appealing and timely, but Garson falls short of elaborating precisely how the madness-as-strategy approach will bolster the Mad Pride Movement or other similar Mad activisms.

The Mad Pride Movement and other Mad activism groups are not homogenous; nor do they share a unified vision on how to empower people diagnosed with madness or how to generate or propel institutional change in the way mad people are understood, treated, and accommodated. In fact, the resourcefulness of these movements is due to the diversity of the visions of its members. While some individuals find hope, resilience, and energy when they distance themselves from madness-as-dysfunction approaches, reject using psychotropic drugs, and choose to work with their delusions without labelling them as illness, many individuals in Mad activist groups situate themselves somewhere between the madness-as-dysfunction and madness-as-strategy views. They choose, for example, to use medications to cope with their anxiety, while having a critical attitude towards reductionisms in psychiatry that take anxiety to be a mere breakdown of brain circuitry, attempting to understand themselves and to situate their anxiety in the broader social, psychological, and biological networks of their lives (for examples of testimonies of different threads of attitudes towards one’s madness, see Tekin 2016, 2014, 2011; Tekin and Outram 2018). In fact, what matters most is a person’s self-narrative about their putative mental disorders, which is a combination of their critical gaze in making sense of their experiences and their responses to various scientific or folk narratives about these so-called disorders. This might mean the madness-as-dysfunction narrative can sometimes be as resourceful as the madness-as-strategy view in helping the mad person navigate psychological, social, and physical environments and flourish. The ultimate source of power in living well and flourishing with madness is the agency of the mad person, who does not always choose madness-as-strategy over madness-as-dysfunction. In fact, for the mad, those two ways of seeing the self often sit in very close proximity to each other.

Part of the difficulty involved in situating Garson’s madness-as-strategy vision in the various Mad activist movements stems from his purposeful decision to avoid working with confined definitions. When he examines madness-as-strategy, he doesn’t explain what it is a strategy for; rather, he illustrates how different strands of thought understood this strategy. It was different for the Greek magicians than for Freud, for example. Similarly, in laying out the madness-as-dysfunction view, Garson does not offer a fixed notion of where the dysfunction lies, as it does look different to Kant than to the proponents of RDoC. Ultimately, this is why Garson’s analysis is rich, compelling, and even poetic. It leaves a lot to our imagination, forcing all of us—philosophers, historians, teachers, students, intellectuals, clinicians, and counsellors—to see what a wonderful joy madness can be and to embrace different ways of existing and flourishing in the world. Not least, it opens the door to a new space, a new style of reasoning in research and treatment in contemporary medicine.


Bluhm, R. 2017. Evidence-Based Medicine, Biological Psychiatry, and the Role of Science in Medicine. In Extraordinary Science and Psychiatry: Responses to the Crisis in Mental Health Research. Poland, J. and Tekin, Ş. eds. Boston: MIT Press, 37–58.

Garson, J. 2022. Madness: A Philosophical Exploration. Oxford University Press.

Insel T, Cuthbert B, Garvey M, et al. Research domain criteria (RDoC): toward a new classification framework for research on mental disorders. Am J Psychiatry. 2010; 167 (7): 748–751.

Tekin, Ş., Outram, S. 2018. Overcoming Mental Disorder Stigma: A Short Analysis of Patient Memoirs. Journal of Evaluation in Clinical Practice2411141119.

Tekin, Ş.  2016. Are Mental Disorders Natural Kinds? A Plea for a New Approach to Intervention in Psychiatry. Philosophy, Psychiatry, and Psychology, Volume 23, No: 2, 147–163.

Tekin, Ş. 2014. Self-Insight in the Time of Mood Disorders: After the Diagnosis, Beyond the Treatment. Philosophy, Psychiatry, and Psychology; 21 (2), 139–155.

Tekin, Ş. 2011. Self-Concept through the Diagnostic Looking Glass: Narratives and Mental Disorder. Philosophical Psychology; 24:3, 357–380.