Maimonides in His World: Portrait of a Mediterranean Thinker

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Sarah Stroumsa, Maimonides in His World: Portrait of a Mediterranean Thinker, Princeton UP, 2009, 222pp., $39.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780691137636.

Reviewed by David Burrell, C.S.C., University of Notre Dame/Uganda Martyrs University



A portrait sensitively and accurately limned: Moses ben Maimon in Mediterranean Islamic context. Sarah Stromsa does so well, I suspect, because she possesses the linguistic tools (Hebrew and Arabic, but above all Arabic), is a trained philosopher (with Daniel Gimaret at the Sorbonne), and is gifted with a perceptivity which allows her to engage gracefully in astute criticism of other ‘takes’ on Maimonides. In fact, the cultural portrait also suggests why this thinker has been read in such diverse ways, yielding ‘my Monidies’ and ‘your Monides’. She pinpoints one salient division in interpretation: between a ‘Jewish thinker’ primarily in dialogue with Jewish authors, “for whom the Islamic world provides only the background” (189), and a more ecumenical approach which “assumes medieval Jewish philosophy to have been shaped by the surrounding [Islamic] culture and impregnated by it — [Schlomo] Pines’ approach to which [Stroumsa] subscribes” (190).

As do I as well, initiated as a Mediterranean person more than fifty years ago in Rome, later confirmed in Jerusalem, Cairo, and the Etz Hayyim synagogue in Hania (Crete). Moreover, this perspective can help highlight the affinities between Moses Maimonides and Thomas Aquinas, as well as explain why European scholars of Aquinas, focused on his sojourns in Paris and in Cologne, overlooked his crucial exchange with Jewish and with Islamic thinkers, quite natural to the Mediterranean person like Aquinas. Finally, they were each involved in a similar task: to persuade their religious communities to employ philosophical strategies in developing their respective traditions. (This was the primary emphasis in Pope Benedict XVI’s Regensburg address in 2007, whose major thrust was distracted by a contested example used to pay homage to a former colleague at the university.) This task led them both to mine the intellectual worlds surrounding them, putting Aquinas in an exchange with “Rabbi Moses”, where his trenchant criticism of his Jewish predecessor betrays that singular way philosophers have of giving homage to one another. As she underscores at the end of the work, Stromsa’s way of approaching her subject has implications beyond that of an individual portrait, implications that emerge the more effectively as the portrait itself is executed with attention to the world in which the Rambam [=Rabbi Moses ben Maimon] lived. Yet we must recall that it has been a world virtually ignored by both Jewish and Christian interpreters, yet currently one which knocks on our doors, demanding the sensitive and accurate delineation this work offers. Indeed, anyone wishing to inquire further into the way divergent readings of the Rambam might be rooted in differing attitudes towards exchange with surrounding cultures found between Jews in Christendom [Ashkenazi] and Jews in the Islamicate [Sephardim] would well begin with this cultural analysis of Maimonides, though it barely attends to this feature dividing world Jewry, perhaps due to the parlous situation in Israel itself.

Let us consider the arenas her inquiry treats so perspicaciously. The first chapter offers a “rapid panorama of Maimonides’ activity [to] give a foretaste of his broad spectrum: … the philosopher, the erudite, the man of law, the leader of the community” (22). Comparing him with Saadia, she sees both of them as

high-water marks of the Jewish Mediterranean society. Saadia in the tenth century, marks the consolidation and coming of age of the Judaeo-Arabic Mediterranean culture. Maimonides, at the close of the twelfth century, marks the turning of the tide, the end of an era: the beginning of the waning of Islamic culture, the rise of European intellectual power, and, as part of this process, the great shift occurring within the Jewish world (23).

The next chapter details his extensive familiarity with Islamic theologians, including al-Ghazali, relying on recent scholars to identify allusions to the work of this creative thinker whom he never mentioned by name. We are offered a veritable cornucopia of the variety of thinking which Maimonides roundly criticized, kalâm — a category into which the Rambam also placed “Christian apologetic writing, … reinforced by the power of the state.” Yet her "kalâm, that is to say, theology" (27) is too quick an identification, evidenced by her later identifying Maimonides’ principal philosophical work, the Guide, as “by nature theological in the sense that it is dedicated to the effort to harmonize philosophy with scripture.” Here she contrasts his theological inquiry “with the particular theological system called kalâm (38), better denominated ‘apologetics’. For it was precisely the lack of substantive elaboration of the kalâm tradition, rather than virtually repeating it, which annoyed Maimonides with this genre in Islamic writing, so it would be misleading for western readers to call it ‘theology’. And Maimonides’ own acquaintance with it, revealed in the topics he chooses for comment, only shows how much his own inquiry transforms the genre into something closer to what we should call ‘theology’, hence Stroumsa’s correction of the initial identification. But as for the Rambam’s actual manner of proceeding, that seems rather beholden to Almohad thinkers from Andalusia.

”NDPRBodyTexT">Provocatively entitled “An Almohad ‘Fundamentalist’”, chapter three traces the lineaments of Almohad [lit., supporters of the unity of God] theology from his birthplace in Cordoba to north Africa in which Maimonides “spent twenty years of his life — between 1148 and 1165 — under the Almohads” (59). Ibn Tumart is a key figure, but Stroumsa names many others, delineating the Rambam’s genealogy with reference to legal rulings — back to the sources, comparing and contrasting his recommended procedures for interpreting sacred texts with those of Ibn Rushd [Averroës], even suggesting that Maimonides’ “identifying true monotheism with a noncorporeal perception of God” aligns him with Ibn Tumart’s school of thought (71). It is especially “Maimonides’ overall perception of the role of the ruler that is modeled according to Almohad thought” (77). In particular, his “depiction of the Messiah is characterized by an overwhelming insistence on his military role” (78). Yet it is here that we must recall that

the status of Maimonides within his own community was strikingly different from that of the Muslim philosophers of his generation within their society[. Indeed], as the spiritual leader of a minority group, [he] could feel, perhaps more than a Muslim philosopher marginalized in the court, that he was able to shape the minds of his flock, [leaving] him, paradoxically, more freedom to adopt Almohad ideology than that left to his Muslim counterparts (79).

The veins of interpretation mined in this chapter, assiduously traced to Islamic sources, may make it the richest chapter in this inquiry.

Chapter four, “La longue durée”, on his phenomenology of religions, and chapter five, “A Critical Mind”, on Maimonides as scientist, are largely expository, but each gives Stroumsa an opportunity to assess the Rambam’s critical acumen, with a particular fascination for his obloquy towards pseudo-science, which he labels “ravings” [hadhayânât], mimicking a “standard practice among Muslim writers” (143), here directed against “the tenth-century freethinking philosopher and physician, Abu Bakr al-Râzi’s [notion] that there is more evil than good in what exists” (142). (Aquinas also finds this judgment abhorrent in the main, though he finds it uncannily accurate for humankind!)

The chapter crowning the study, “‘From Moses to Moses’: Maimonides’ Vision of Perfection”, begins by comparing the Rambam’s concerns with those of Avicenna, who had recourse to “parables and similes to render an idea of spiritual bliss” (155), making the carnal similes of the Qur’an more acceptable. While the Hebrew scriptures had no comparable set of descriptions, “a philosopher like Maimonides had to contend with popular views that were much the same as those with which Avicenna had struggled” (157). He avoided “corporeal imagery of paradise … by rejecting the Rabbis’ identification of the Garden of Eden with the ultimate reward.” While “this demythologizing leaves the concept of the world to come as unrelated to other concepts” (159), "the Guide gives us a glimpse of a positive description of Maimonides’ understanding of paradise." Describing the lot of the “perfect man” who has attained

most of the moral virtues, and all the more that of pure thought, which is achieved through the perfection of the intelligibles that lead to passionate love [ishq] of Him. [And once] the soul is separated from the body, … the Sages … call the apprehension that is achieved in a state of intense and passionate love for Him, may He be exalted, a kiss… . After having reached this condition of enduring permanence, that intellect remains in one and the same state, … and he will remain permanently in that state of intense pleasure (Guide 3.51, at 162).

Commenting on this unusual use of evocative language by the Rambam, Stroumsa proposes (and I would concur) that “his description of the bliss of the perfect souls rings with the exultation and rapture of the believer” (164). Other commentators, notably Pines (whom she usually follows) and Davidson, find this passage suspect because it is so unusual in its rhetorical excess. Yet the Guide has strained throughout towards a transcendent pinnacle of understanding available to human beings conjoined with the intelligibles.

Beginning with the assertion that "like most falâsifa, Maimonides did not think of the bliss in the hereafter in terms of individual survival" (162), Stroumsa offers a studied attempt to assess the ambiguities in philosophers’ “statements about the possibility of immortality [which] vary in intensity, and sometimes even in content,” adjudicating that

such cases as Maimonides’ Guide 3.51 (or for that matter, Avicenna’s Ishârât), where the philosopher abandons technical language to expand on his perception of the hereafter, the [very] language is a clear sign that what he says reflects exactly what he thinks at the moment, regardless of what he may have said before or after. It is a clear expression of his confidence in the awaiting felicity (165).

Maimonides’ own Treatise on Resurrection has elicited contentious commentary, largely because of its outspoken language. In a complex contextual exegesis of 18 pages, Stroumsa traces the genesis of the text to a running debate with the Gaon in Baghdad, quite jealous of a rising predilection for the Rambam among Mediterranean Jewish communities, and more pointedly, sees him responding to his protégé Joseph’s attempt to pre-empt discussion in a letter entitled “the Silencing Epistle”, which triggers the staged debate between the two luminaries. From one point of view, this short treatise offers nothing new in affirming resurrection, confirming the way Guide 1.42 cites the Talmudic saying, “The righteous are called living even when they are dead” (180). Yet in the light of his clear predilection for immortality of soul, one wonders why Maimonides should insist, as he does in his ‘creed’, on obligatory belief in the resurrection of the dead. Stroumsa cuts the Gordian knot by suggesting that

in instituting a list of legally binding dogmas that define the boundaries of Judaism, [he] followed the example of the Almohads, [and especially of] their source of inspiration, Ghazali, who counted the denial of the resurrection as one of the marks of the philosophers’ heresy.


like Avicenna and Averroës, [he] adopted the position that the eschatological scene is dictated by texts and should not be interpreted, … so forcing him to repeat did not bring him to elaborate. He could only reiterate his position: the resurrection of the dead is an article of faith, nothing less, nothing more (182).

This exegetical excursus fairly epitomizes the quality of detailed and sensitive discussion found throughout her inquiry, sure to lead others to understand this Moses “as a superb example of a Mediterranean thinker” (191), whose life and work exemplifies “the incessant move of his inner pendulum between the conflicting facets of his person: ‘from Moses’ the leader who suffered his community, to ‘Moses’ the philosopher, who sought the face of God” (188).