Maimonides on the Origin of the World

Placeholder book cover

Kenneth Seeskin, Maimonides on the Origin of the World, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 224pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 052184553X.

Reviewed by Daniel H. Frank, Purdue University


Over the years Maimonides' thoughts about the origin of the world have elicited much discussion. In this well written book Kenneth Seeskin joins the debate. From as early as the thirteenth century, commencing with Samuel Ibn Tibbon, the translator of the Guide of the Perplexed into Hebrew, the regnant view has been to disbelieve what Maimonides is prima facie committed to in the Guide, namely, creation ex nihilo, the biblical view that leaves the creator complete freedom to create what, and when, it likes. The regnant view, entailing the denial of such divine freedom, drives Maimonides into the camp of either Plato or Aristotle, (actually) believing that either the world is created de novo (from pre-existent matter, as in Plato's Timaeus) or it is uncreated, eternal. To be sure, Maimonides considers the candidacy of each of these views, but for Seeskin, Maimonides means what he says in favoring creation ex nihilo. In this particular case, the 'straight' reading is the road less traveled.

In its own way, this book is a philosophical response to a 'theological-political' reading of Maimonides' Guide of the Perplexed. This latter way of reading the Guide, championed by Leo Strauss amongst others, understands Maimonides' general project in the Guide as one of safely repositioning the religious intellectual squarely in the community of believers, from which he is temporarily alienated. Joseph, Maimonides' erstwhile student and the addressee of the Guide, is a smart young man who has become perplexed, and alienated, by having tasted a bit of science and finding that difficult to square with the traditional religious norms in which he has been reared. Maimonides' goal in the Guide, according to the theological-political interpretation of it, is to address Joseph's perplexity and to show him that, properly understood, religion and science are not at odds with each other. Joseph's perplexity is overcome by revealing the commensurability of science and the Law. The problem with this view, that of proving the 'respectability' of Scripture in the eyes of the religious intellectual, is that there is a manifest presumption that it is Scripture that needs to be revised. To be sure, Maimonides often, not invariably, revises the literal meaning of Scriptural text when it is incoherent. His negative theology is a good case in point. Given that God is one and incorporeal, certain biblical texts need to be reinterpreted to square with this. Maimonides is doubtless on the side of those who wish to offer a conception of God that coheres with philosophical intelligibility.

As noted, this general presumption about the 'unphilosophicality' of Scripture, with the attendant unease for the religious intellectual, seems to demand that biblical doctrines such as the origin of the world ex nihilo must be revised to bring them into line with science and philosophical intelligibility. But in this latter case Maimonides manifestly does not do so. In his discussion of creation and eternity in the second part of the Guide, Maimonides clearly indicates that Aristotle did not prove the eternity of the world, and hence creation of some sort is a possibility. And against Plato, who argues for creation of the world from pre-existent matter, Seeskin well points out that '[if] one wishes to emphasize creation ex nihilo [as does Maimonides on behalf of the biblical account], there is no real difference between the views of Plato and Aristotle because they both believe in the eternity of matter." (55) Whatever the manifest and deep differences between Plato and Aristotle on cosmological issues, there is an even greater gap between both and the biblical account.

But can Maimonides mean what he says here, that the world is created, not just de novo, but ex nihilo? The theological-political reading, championed by Strauss, answers in the negative, in large part because of the aforementioned general presumption about the 'unphilosophicality' of Scripture. According to this presumption, as we have seen in the case of negative theology, Scripture needs to be, and in fact is, reinterpreted as necessary. Now, in the present case concerning cosmogony, according to the theological-political reading, Maimonides must be suppressing, or hiding, his real view (whatever it is supposed to be), because he is manifestly not reinterpreting the biblical account. The presumption about the unphilosophicality of Scripture stands fast, entailing disingenuity in the present case. Joseph's perplexity is overcome by understanding that in the case of the origin of the world, the truth of the matter cannot be revealed.

But why should one go along with the Straussian presumption, and its deep-seated dichotomy between reason and revelation (Athens and Jerusalem)? Why in the present case does Maimonides not reinterpret biblical texts on creation, in a manner analogous to his reinterpretation of other 'anthropomorphizing' texts? Maimonides is clear (in Guide 2.25) that he would iff it were demanded philosophically. That is, if Aristotle had in fact proven the eternity of the world, he would reinterpret Genesis accordingly. Maimonides really believes that there is no proof available for the Aristotelian view, hence creation is a live option, and textual reinterpretation is not in this case mandated. Here is a perfectly good (philosophical) reason, in fact an inference to the best explanation, for holding the view he prima facie holds. The Straussian of course disbelieves Maimonides here, seeing extra-philosophical forces at work, such that the explicit philosophical argumentation carries no weight.

One wonders why in the present case Maimonides should not be believed. Why should his explicit argument for (the possibility of) creation ex nihilo be dismissed as, well, misleading, as a verbal maneuver? It can only be on account of the presumption that the biblical view is philosophically suspect, analogous to traditional beliefs such as the corporeality of the deity. As these latter are viewed as at odds with the oneness, unity, of God, so the biblical account of creation is viewed as stemming from a view of the deity as like an artisan. Both alike cannot stand, and if not explicitly reinterpreted, must be disbelieved.

But this view about the unphilosophicality of the biblical account of creation begs the question. Further, the suppression of the (supposed) truth about the eternity of the world carries no weight apart from the initial presumption. Again, why should Maimonides not be believed? Is it just because in this case his belief is consistent with tradition. And why cannot tradition be accepted at face value? In fact, Maimonides' view is not so traditional as those who would dismiss it believe. Seeskin is very solid in pointing out the rather radical libertarianism of the Maimonidean view, as well as its anti-essentialism. Indeed, Maimonides himself points in the same direction.

In Guide 2.30 Maimonides says, "I have already made it known to you that the foundation of the whole Law is the view that God brought the world into being out of nothing." For Maimonides, the very foundation of the Law would be nullified if eternity were proven. If the world were always in the form in which we currently find it, never having been different, the revelation of the Law at Sinai would be unaccountable, and with it, the possibility of repentance. For the Straussian, it is just this implication of antinomian possibilities that accounts for Maimonides suppressing his real view about the eternity of the world. But here again the question is begged.

In fact, Maimonides' entire discussion on the origin of the world is an honest attempt to understand what can be known, canvassing the very best views that have historically been presented. As Seeskin well points out, Maimonides demarcates sharply between creation of the world and generation and corruption in it, so radically demarcating the distinction as to block any inference from temporal change to pre-temporal creation, or from temporal production to creation de novo. Further, in a chapter devoted to Plotinus and metaphysical causation, Seeskin insists that "[t]he most serious problem in trying to reconcile Plotinus with biblical religion has to do with volition. Is the first principle an agent who acts for a purpose or merely a cause from which the world proceeds? This is another way of asking whether it makes sense to say that the first principle is free." (116)

Indeed, it is Maimonides' radical libertarianism, his anti-essentialism that accounts for his cosmological views. For him, the world does not have to exist. That it does is due to a creator who creates as it pleases, and whenever it deems appropriate. Once we have creation, Maimonides is content to give the nod to Aristotle and his views on the structure of the world. A subject of some controversy, which Seeskin does not shy away from (165ff), is the eternity of the world a parte post. The issue at hand is whether the world, having been created, will/not be destroyed. Maimonides at 2.29 seems clearly to suggest that the world will continue ad infinitum. It should be noted that here, as elsewhere, Maimonides sides with Aristotle when he can. His disagreement with Aristotle on the eternity of the world is strictly philosophical, grounded in a disanalogy between God and its creation, but Maimonides has absolutely no disagreement with Aristotle about how best to understand the world as it now is, and will be.

Seeskin's book is a solid contribution to the growing literature on the greatest of the medieval Jewish thinkers, an Aristotelian through and through, except when he, for good reason, disagrees with his Greek forebear.