Mainstream and Formal Epistemology

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Vincent F. Hendricks, Mainstream and Formal Epistemology, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 188pp., $56.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521857899.

Reviewed by Horacio Arló-Costa, Carnegie Mellon University


For more than two decades since the beginning of the 1960's mainstream epistemology became intimately connected to other, neighboring disciplines, such as logic or the philosophy of science. To take two approximate reference dates, we can select the publication of Jaakko Hintikka's Knowledge and Belief in 1962 to begin this interdisciplinary cycle, and the date of publication of Isaac Levi's The Enterprise of Knowledge in 1983 to close it. Either book would be considered today a contribution to the discipline that now is usually called formal epistemology. This nomenclature exists today perhaps as a result of a split between mainstream epistemology on the one hand and logic and science on the other that dominated the philosophical scene during the 1980's and 1990's. The many epistemologists who continued to be motivated by scientific developments during the last two decades of the 20th century tended to gravitate towards the scientific communities that preserved an interest in epistemological issues, such as philosophy of science, AI, statistics, the social sciences or its various intersections.

Hendricks' book seems to be one of the many symptoms of a change of attitude inside and outside philosophy reminiscent of the wave of work initiated by the publication of Hintikka's Knowledge and Belief in the early sixties. Hendricks reviews various strands of logical, philosophical and scientific work that matter for epistemological issues while using the notion of forcing as the unifying theme:

In set theory a powerful combinatorial technique for proving statements consistent with the axioms of set theory was invented by P. Cohen in the 1960's. The technique is called forcing. In particular Cohen developed forcing in order to prove that the negation of the Axiom of Choice and the negation of the Continuum Hypothesis are consistent with the axioms of set theory. Today there are various ways of using the forcing technique. One way is to construct an object with certain properties or to construct a model in which there are no objects with certain properties, thus forcing what you want directly (p. 1-2).

Hendricks sees many formalisms in epistemic logic and learning theory as anti-skeptic tools where undesirable epistemic options are ruled out by fiat. Given a universe of states this can be accomplished via different technical devices ranging from using an accessibility relation or a similarity relation, to specifying a particular learning problem in the case of learning theory. Therefore the author has to do some work adapting to his unifying framework formalisms that were not conceived initially with skeptical preoccupations in mind. The approach has its own internal limitations. For example, the nature of the universe of options over which the forcing operates varies deeply across the many reviewed formalisms and semi-formal approaches.

Hendricks quotes Hintikka approvingly when he criticizes the almost universal appeal to possible worlds both in philosophical logic and formal epistemology:

In order to speak of what a certain person a knows and does not know, we have to assume a class ('space') of possibilities. These possibilities will be called scenarios. Philosophers typically call them possible worlds. This usage is a symptom of intellectual megalomania (Hintikka, 2003, p. 19, quoted in p. 8)

The issue is not simply terminological. The so called 'model sets' used by Hintikka in his seminal essay Knowledge and Belief (Hintikka, 1962) are not complete linguistic descriptions of possible worlds. But when the author presents Hintikka's account of knowledge in chapter 6 (p. 82) the reference to model sets is suppressed and his account is assimilated to a standard Kripkean account via the use of possible worlds. Nevertheless the nature of the 'space of options,' as Hintikka calls it, matters for many issues including the nature of the alternativeness relation built in the model and a fortiori for the nature of the forcing relation itself. I shall elaborate immediately on this point with certain detail in order to make it more salient.

A model set MS for Hintikka is any set of sentences closed under the following rules:

(C.¬ ) If A ∈ MS, then ¬A ∉ MS.

(C.∧) If A∧B ∈ MS, then A ∈ MS and B ∈ MS.

(C.∨) If A∨B ∈ MS, then A ∈ MS or B ∈ MS.

(C. ¬¬) If ¬¬A ∈ MS, then A ∈ MS.

(C.¬∧) If ¬(A ∧ B) ∈ MS, then ¬A ∈ MS or ¬B ∈ MS.

(C.¬∨) If ¬(A ∨ B) ∈ MS, then ¬A ∈ MS and ¬B ∈ MS.

In order to study knowledge Hintikka proposes to extend this account with the following two rules (where 'Kap' stands for `agent a knows that p):

(C.KK*) If "Kap" ∈ MS, and if MS* is an alternative to MS (with respect to a) in some model system, then "Kap" ∈ MS*.

(C.K) If "Kap" ∈ MS, then p ∈ MS.

How can we present this in terms of a semantics that resembles the usual possible worlds presentation? One option particularly sensitive to the fact that model sets allow for representing partial information, is to use model-theoretic ideas developed by computer scientists to represent non-monotonic relations (Krauss et al., 1990). Let M =〈W, Ω R, l〉be a Hintikka model where W is a set of possible worlds, Ω is a set of model sets (or a model system), R is an alternativeness relation on Ω, and l is a labeling function l:Ω → 2W such that w ∈ l(s) if and only if for every α ∈ s, w |= α (where '|=' is the standard semantic turnstile). We can now define a new semantic turnstile:

s |≡ α if and only if for all w, such that w ∈ l(s), w |= α

Notice that this new semantic relation allows for representing partial information in the sense that one can have s |/≡ α and s|/≡ ¬α. Finally we can introduce knowledge as follows:

s |≡ Kα if and only if for all s', such that sRs', s' |≡ α.

As Baker explains in (Baker, 1978): '[m]odel sets are not complete descriptions of possible worlds. They are only partial descriptions, large enough to show that the state of affairs in question is really possible (p. 89)'.[1] The model sketched above takes advantage of these features of model sets and emphasizes the relevance of these features for defining forcing relations in terms of them. In fact, as Hintikka (1962) explains, the alternativeness relation used in his model is not symmetric, while, as Hendricks explains, a possible world semantics for a knowledge operator may perfectly well include symmetry as a constraint on the alternativeness relation (defined in a space of possible worlds or richer 'global states' as in Fagin et al. (1996)).[2] In addition, the type of semantics proposed above (already implicit in the pioneering (Hintikka, 1962)) tackles some of the problems flowing from assuming logical omniscience in a different manner than usual. Even when most of the axioms usually associated with logical omniscience (like the K principle) remain valid, the evaluations are made over states that permit a partial encoding of information and the models use a non-standard semantic turnstile reflecting this fact.[3] The previous analysis shows that one of the main causes of logical omniscience is the relational nature of the models used to represent knowledge and not the completeness or incompleteness of the model sets used in the model.

As the author points out, logical omniscience can be relaxed if we extend Hintikka's treatment of epistemic modalities and use the Scott-Montague account in terms of neighborhoods (Arló-Costa, 2002, and Arló-Costa and Pacuit, 2005). But the previous presentation of Hintikka models suggests that we can extend these models as well with the techniques of neighborhood semantics, abandoning both completeness at the level of points and the relational account. An account equivalent to Hintikka's models, but in terms of neighborhood semantics can be obtained as follows:

[|α|] = {s ∈ S: s |≡ α}

This gives a 'truth set' for α in terms of states rather than worlds. Now we can define as well: N(s) = {X ⊆ S: {s': sRs'} ⊆ X}. Finally we can define alternatively:

s |≡ Kα if and only if [|α|] ∈ N(s)

But, of course, once we see that this account is possible we can systematically investigate neighborhoods N of partial states of this type, even those for which there is no pointwise equivalent relational Hintikka model.[4] These systems achieve various degrees of freedom from logical omniscience, both at the level of the points assumed in the model (which are not the usual megalomaniac possible worlds) and at the level of the frame structure itself which ceases to be relational. I am not aware of the systematic study of models and frames of these types.

It is true, though, that, as the author points out, Hintikka's account induces a partition of the set of states of affaires, '[t]he compartment consisting of [options] compatible with the attitude in question and the compartment of [options] incompatible with them (p. 81)'. As we just saw, nevertheless, Hintikka's alternativeness relation induces a partition of model sets, rather than a partition of the usual possible worlds (treated as semantic primitives), or a partition of the even richer 'possibilia' posited by David Lewis in (Lewis, 1996) -- which are composite entities with epistemic components.[5]

There is perhaps a uniform mechanism of exclusion of alternatives in all these different formalisms, except that what is excluded (sometimes in order to defeat the skeptic) varies from model to model, ranging from the very rich Lewis's possibilia to the minimalist representation in terms of model sets. And sometimes these differences in the domain under consideration are important both from a logical and a philosophical point of view, as I argued above. A slight problem with the presentation in the book is that in order to have a unified, parametric account, the universe of epistemic options in the comparisons across formalisms is always constituted by a set of possible worlds of the usual sort employed in philosophical logic.

To illustrate the tension between the mainstream strand of contemporary epistemology and the formal one, we can use a quotation from a book on causation by my colleagues Peter Spirtes, Clark Glymour and Richard Scheines. The book is a typical example of self-reflecting formal epistemology in action. And although the reference is to causation we invite the reader to replace the word 'causation' by the corresponding (bracketed) occurrence of the word 'knowledge'.

One approach to clarifying the notion of causation [knowledge] -- the philosopher's approach ever since Plato -- is to try to define 'causation' [knowledge]… [A]nother approach to the same problem -- the mathematician's approach ever since Euclid -- is to provide axioms that use the notion of causation [knowledge] without defining it, and to investigate the necessary consequences of those assumptions. We have a few fruitful examples of the first sort of clarification, but many of the second: Euclid's geometry, Newton's physics, Frege's and Hilbert's logics, Kolmogorov's probability. (Spirtes et al., 2000)

What the authors call the mathematician's strategy is also a fruitful philosophical strategy, namely the axiomatic method used initially by Hintikka and others, which has intimate connections with the use of forcing as Hendricks understands it. For in the axiomatic approach, one builds up by fiat a notion of knowledge satisfying some axioms corresponding to certain rationality conditions on the modeled agents, and one does so by fiat even if this requires excluding certain epistemic options corresponding to irrationality.

But Hendricks's book is rather careful and he does introduce further distinctions as well, like the distinction between the first person point of view and the third person point of view. This is indeed an additional issue one has to take into account to classify different forms of forcing, which is discussed in various places, perhaps most prominently in the chapter devoted to logical epistemology (where Hintikka's view is mainly discussed). This distinction is rather important and at the same time elusive. Hintikka uses Moorean examples to mark a distinction between two ways of indexing belief operators. He is interested in the asymmetry between

(I) Ba(p ∧ ¬Bb(p))


(II) Ba(p ∧ ¬Ba(p))

This asymmetry is sometimes indicated by translating a as the first-person singular pronoun and b as the third-person singular pronoun:

(II-1) I believe that the case is as follows: p but I do not believe that p

(I-1) I believe that the case is as follows: he was at home but I did not believe that p

where (II-1) is paradoxical while (I-1) is not. But Hintikka also points out that

[t]he paradoxical character of 'p, but I do not believe that p' does not turn on the peculiarities of the first person singular pronoun, in the sense that (II) is indefensible no matter what a is (whether a name or a personal pronoun). (p. 52)

Hintikka has in mind:

(II-2) a believes that the case is as follows: p but a does not believe that p

which he sees as paradoxical as well. So, there is an important difference in epistemic indexing that Hendricks does well in noting, except that the difference in question, aside from being elusive, does not need to flow entirely from the logical asymmetries between the first and third person singular pronouns.[6]

After preparing the terrain in chapters one and two the book begins in earnest in chapter three with a thorough examination of certain forms of reliability in epistemology, especially the form of epistemic reliabilism defended in various writings by Alvin Goldman. Chapter 4, on counterfactual epistemology, examines notions of knowledge a la Dretske-Nozick in terms of tracking the truth. In this case forcing is tacitly introduced via similarity relations used to evaluate the counterfactual conditionals that are needed to characterize knowledge. The discussion is sensitive to the fact that one of the central features of this notion of knowledge is that it fails closure principles, especially the principle of closure under known implication.

As is explained later on in chapter 6 (devoted to logical epistemology), formalizing Nozick's notion of knowledge remains a rich and open problem.[7] Hendricks comments on page 58 that the main preoccupation of Nozick is to define knowledge '[h]ere and now rather than to guarantee convergence in the long run.' Nevertheless, Nozick's account utilizes (in its most refined presentation) the notion of method, whose full formalization requires the explicit introduction of a temporal logic at least. Some formal models of this notion (like the one offered in (Arló-Costa and Parikh, 2006) present Nozick's notion in a manner that is more amenable to studying convergence problems as well as an assessment of knowledge instant by instant.

Chapter 5 switches to a study of the various contextual epistemologies motivated by the work of David Lewis and Keith DeRose among many others. Of course this strand of epistemological studies suits Hendricks's idea of forcing perfectly. I remind the reader that the idea here is to say that S knows that p if and only if S's evidence eliminates every possibility in which not-P, except for those possibilities that we are properly ignoring. Possibilia here are nevertheless rather rich, including as parts the de se evidence of the modeled agents, as well as information about the environment. So, as we explained above, the options that are forced out by the agent's evidence or the options that are properly ignored (according to suitable rules) are not the usual possible worlds but rich epistemic versions of them. Many game theorists have proposed similar encodings of worlds as composite entities with epistemic components (like the type of the player or strategies admissible to the modeled agents). Here the main inference rules related to logical omniscience, like closure under known entailment, hold only locally without skepticism.

Chapter 6 focuses on logical epistemology. The idea is to offer an overview of work in epistemic logic, where the work of Jaakko Hintikka occupies a central role. Following a classification proposed by Hintikka, Hendricks reviews two 'waves' of work in this area. The first focuses on a static analysis of knowledge of isolated agents, while the second focuses on dynamic aspects of the agents in question:

Surely the business of any successful theory of knowledge is how new knowledge can be achieved, not merely how previously obtained information can be evaluated. A theory of information (knowledge) acquisition is both philosophically and humanely much more important than a theory of whether already achieved information amounts to knowledge or not. Discovery is more important than the defense of what you already know.

The last three chapters combine the tools of logical epistemology, philosophical analysis and computational learning theory to deliver a logic of discovery of active agents understood as inquiry methods operating in branching time.

The basic notions of computational learning theory are introduced in chapter seven via an ornithological example. Hendricks considers a scientist worried about whether all ravens are black. He then considers two discovery methods used to establish whether this is so. One is a bold one where after seeing a black raven the method conjectures black and stays put until an eventual non-black raven is seen. An alternative is a skeptical method that refuses to jump to conclusions and does not produce a universal hypothesis unless completely justified by data. So, this second method will conclude that not all ravens are black after seeing a non-black raven, but will refuse to advance conjectures even after seeing a very large class of black ravens. It is easy to see that the bold method succeeds over all relevant possible worlds circumscribed (or 'forced') by the epistemic problem, also called the background knowledge; while the skeptical method doesn't. For if our world is one where there are only black ravens the skeptical method will fail to stabilize to a true conclusion. In contrast, the bold method with converge to the truth in the long run.

A nested hierarchy of convergence criteria and various definitions of success are provided and discovery is then defined as follows: 'The discovery method identifies a true hypothesis in the limit in a possible world if in it there exists a true hypothesis h and the discovery method limiting converges to h.'

Modal operator epistemology is presented in chapter 8. It consists in a rich environment containing temporal, epistemic and computational operators deployed to study the validity of limit convergent knowledge. The main idea of this notion of convergence is that to obtain limit convergent knowledge the agent has to converge to the true hypothesis only in the possible worlds consistent with what has been observed so far. The book closes with a chapter devoted to the interplay of various agents (plethoric epistemology).

Formal epistemology is today a vast discipline with many sub-branches. Hendricks reviews many of them and assesses their philosophical importance. But of course there are other aspects of formal epistemology that cannot possibly be considered in a single volume. Examples are Bayesian epistemology and the plethoric part of formal epistemology devoted to belief change that here is only considered under the point of view of leaning theory, with its insistence on convergence to the truth in the long run rather than in the immediacy of the next step of inquiry. Interactive epistemology (borrowing the terminology proposed by Robert Aumann) is considered here only in passing as well. But the fact that the book focuses on a subset of formal epistemology 's branches and their philosophical relevance might be a virtue rather than a defect. The book displays an overall interest regarding epistemic reliability and its role both in traditional and formal epistemology, and this interest is instrumental in guiding the selection of relevant topics. This preoccupation runs through the book and provides much of the cement that keeps the different parts suitably interrelated. On the other hand, what has been omitted fits well neither with the long run perspective nor with the focus on reliability, and therefore the omission is acceptable given the purposes of the book.

All things considered Hendricks has succeeded in writing a very useful book mending bridges across areas of inquiry that used to be deeply interrelated in the not so distant past, but that in recent years have come apart. The book is written in a very accessible and terse style, avoiding both notational and dialectical excesses. Philosophically it goes to the heart of issues related to the conceptual significance of a recent plethora of formal work in epistemic logic and learning theory. Formally it offers a very useful landscape of recent work including novel contributions in computational learning theory by the author and collaborators. The book testifies to the interest and strength of recent work in the intersection of epistemology and philosophical logic. I am sure that Hendricks' book will remain as an important point of reference for interdisciplinary discussion in this and related areas of inquiry for years to come.


H. Arló-Costa and R. Parikh (2006) Belief, Knowledge and Tracking the Truth, FEW 2006,

H. Arló-Costa and E. Pacuit (2005) First Order Classical Modal Logic: Applications in logics of knowledge and probability, Proceedings of the Tenth Conference on Theoretical Aspects of Rationality and Knowledge, TARK X, ACM Digital Library and University of Singapore.

H. Arló-Costa (2002) First order extensions of classical systems of modal logic: The role of the Barcan schemas, Studia Logica 71, 87-118.

J. R. Baker (1978) Essentialism and the Modal Semantics of J. Hintikka, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, vol XIX, no. 1, 81-91.

R. Fagin, J. Halpern, Y. Moses and M. Vardi (1996) Reasoning about Knowledge, Cambridge, MA, MIT Press.

J. Hintikka (1962) Knowledge and Belief: An Introduction to the Logic of the Two Notions, Cornell University Press.

J. Hintikka (2003) A Second Generation Epistemic Logic and its General Significance, in Hendricks et al. (eds.) Knowledge Contributors, Synthese Library no. 322. Kluwer Academic.

Kraus, S., Lehmann, D. and Magidor, M. (1990) Nonmonotonic reasoning, preferential models and cumulative logics, Artificial Intelligence, 44, 167-207.

I. Levi (1997) The Logic of Full Belief, in The Covenant of Reason: Rationality and the Commitments of Thought, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.

I. Levi (1983) The enterprise of knowledge, MIT Press, Boston.

D. Lewis (1996) Elusive Knowledge, Australian Journal of Philosophy, 74, 549-67.

P. Spirtes, C. Glymour and R. Scheines (2000, 2nd edition) Causation, Prediction and Search, MIT Press, Cambridge, Mass..

[1] {P ∧ (¬Q → R), P, (¬Q → R), ¬¬Q, Q} is an example of a Hintikka set and so is {P} in a language with three atoms P, Q and R.

[2] 'It may be seen that the alternativeness relation is not symmetric. For this purpose, let us recall that a model set MS2 is an alternative to MS1 if, and only if, intuitively speaking, there is nothing about the state of affairs described by the former that is incompatible with what someone knows in the state of affairs described by the latter. Now it is obviously non-excluded by what I know that I should have known more than I now do. But such additional knowledge may very well be incompatible with what still is possible, as far as I know (p. 37)'. This argument seems to fit well with the use of partial states of affairs as primitives rather than worlds. In contrast, most of the accounts of knowledge operators in computer science do obey symmetry (Fagin et al., 1996) and deploy rather rich versions of possible worlds.

[3] Other logical consequences of the construction are discussed in passing in the next footnote. An important fact is that if we introduce possibility by requiring that a sentence is possible at a state s if and only if there is an alternative world s' such that s' |≡ α, then possibility is not the dual of necessity and the modal system validated by all Hintikka models will not be normal (the possibility of A entails ¬K¬A but not vice-versa, although all other axioms and rules of inference of the system K are valid).

[4] There are various possible ways of introducing a possibility operator in this setting, some of which will not be duals of the Box operator (see (Arló-Costa, 2002) for details).

[5] These possibilia implement an even more extreme form of philosophical megalomania by including the de se attitudes of agents as part of the world itself. There are various important similarities between Lewis's epistemic possibilia and the global states posited in Fagin et al. (1996) to study knowledge in computer-science-related applications. In both cases worlds are composite entities rather than semantic primitives, featuring epistemic components.

[6] As Hendricks explains on p. 77, some authors like Isaac Levi (1997) rely on Ramsey's distinction between the logic of truth and the logic of consistency to explain some of the aforementioned asymmetries in epistemic indexing.

[7] See (Arló-Costa and Parikh, 2006) for a preliminary study of this problem.