Mainstreaming Torture: Ethical Approaches in the Post-9/11 United States

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Rebecca Gordon, Mainstreaming Torture: Ethical Approaches in the Post-9/11 United States, Oxford University Press, 2014, 214pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199336432.

Reviewed by Stephen Kershnar, State University of New York at Fredonia


In this book, Rebecca Gordon argues against the use of torture. What is distinctive about it is that she argues that the traditional ethical approaches to evaluating torture (consequentialism and deontology) fail because they evaluate torture as a set of isolated actions rather than as a historically and socially embedded practice. To evaluate such a practice she uses a virtue-ethics approach, focusing on the work of Alasdair MacIntyre to show that the U.S.'s use of torture was and is problematic.[1] Because torture's effect warps the four cardinal virtues (courage, prudence, temperance, and justice), it is problematic and should be prohibited.

Gordon's argument is interesting and new. She nicely weaves in facts about how the U.S. and other countries actually used enhanced interrogation. That said, her argument is ultimately unsuccessful. First, the book's theses are unclear. It is not clear if she is arguing that the use of torture is wrong, bad, or vicious. This makes it difficult to reconstruct her argument. Second, her discussion of the literature misses arguments that are central to the discussion of the deontological status of interrogational torture. In addition, the deontological arguments against torture are provided in list form with little discussion of whether the arguments succeed or how they relate to one another. Third, the virtue-ethics argument falls short.

In chapter one, Gordon sets out an account of torture. She argues that torture is (i) the intentional infliction of severe mental or physical suffering by an official or agent of a political entity (ii) that aims to dismantle the victim's sensory, psychological, or social worlds (iii) with the effect of establishing or maintaining the entity's power (32). This definition is questionable not only because it disallows private citizens from being able to commit torture, but also because it is not clear that torture must have such dismantling aims rather than merely the goal to inflict severe pain for different reasons (for example, information, punishment, or sexual gratification). Nor need torture have the effect of establishing or maintaining power. It is possible for an officer to torture a prisoner immediately before killing him, thus not having either effect.

In chapter two, Gordon argues that U.S. practice in the post-9/11 world satisfies this definition of torture. She argues that because the torture was the result of specific policies that came from various government agencies (for example, Justice Department, Defense Department, and Central Intelligence Agency), it was indeed done by or on behalf of U.S. government officials or agents. She further argues that the contemporaneous journalism and recent historical works indicate that it explicitly aimed at dismantling the victim's sensory, psychological, or social worlds. As evidence, she cites among other things a CIA interrogation manual. Also, she argues that it was done to establish and maintain the U.S. government's power. Specifically, she argues it was done to frighten potential adversaries and reinforce citizens' belief in an existential threat to them and the nation.

In chapter three, Gordon addresses the range of ethical arguments against torture found in the scholarly literature and editorial pages of two major newspapers, The New York Times and The Wall Street Journal. She rejects the utilitarian arguments as focusing on ticking time-bomb cases and argues that such cases are so different from actual practice as to make their conclusions irrelevant. Gordon also argues that in any case, torture does not work and aids enemy recruitment, so that it fails on its own terms. She criticizes the deontological arguments against torture because they focus on isolated acts of torture whose particularity is in sharp contrast to what matters, namely the social and historical practice of torture.

In chapter four, Gordon outlines MacIntyre's theory of virtue ethics noting the central features of his approach. Specifically, she points out that the theory focuses on the telos(the good of human beings), practices (roughly, cooperative practices that allow people to develop virtues), virtues (roughly, enduring habits that allow people to achieve the good of human beings -- that is, the good life), and traditions (roughly, historical streams that help shape the nature of the good life in a particular society). She then defends this account against criticisms that it is a type of moral relativism and is inconsistent with the unity of the virtues.

In chapter five, Gordon argues that torture is a false practice. It is a "coherent and complex form of socially established cooperative activity" (see 10, 107, 128). The problem is that the goods internal to it are the production of truth (rather than its discovery), production of enemies, and reproduction of torturers. This, she argues, torture is destructive to the four cardinal virtues in people: courage, justice, temperance, and prudence. She further argues that this is bad for individuals and the society in which they live.

In chapter seven, Gordon suggests three responses to torture. First, there should be a real end to Bush administration-era policies. Second, there must be a full, public accounting of, and full, public accountability for, the torture practiced in the "war on terror." Third, the country should move forward in a way that allows the development of the four cardinal virtues in such a way that prevents torture from reoccurring and does so for the right reasons.

Gordon's discussion of the literature raises concerns. Consider her discussion of the consequentialist arguments for torture. The CIA and its defenders have claimed that enhanced interrogation worked.[2] They cite the role of enhanced interrogation in disrupting the al Qaeda network, preventing a number of other attacks, and finding Osama bin Laden. They compare this to the FBI's alleged failure to do these things. They also argue that enhanced interrogation is neither morally nor legally torture. The FBI, many neutral sources, and the CIA's numerous and, in some cases, well-informed critics deny these claims. There is a lack of transparency that makes it difficult to adjudicate these claims. If Gordon wants to rest her rejection of the consequentialist argument on her assessment of the evidence, which is not laid out in a systematic, let alone exhaustive, manner, one can follow her argument. However, it is unconvincing to those who view the evidence as supporting the CIA view. The book is unlikely to get anyone to reject it. In any case, this skirmish over whether torture works is beside the point because Gordon and her virtue-ethics compatriots would almost undoubtedly reject the use of torture even if torture did in fact make the world a better place than would alternative practices available to the U.S.

Citing Henry Shue and others, Gordon's second main objection to the consequentialist argument is that the ticking time-bomb conditions will never be met (70).[3] These conditions are that the interrogators know the bomb exists, the captive has the knowledge to prevent its going off, the torture will work quickly enough so this can be done, the information gleaned is truthful and will work to defuse it, the torture will stop when the information is obtained, and so on. This might be an objection to the ticking-time-bomb argument but not to the consequentialist argument. Even if the torture-based interrogation only works 25% of the time and always leads to gratuitous, harmful, and sadistic torture, this still might be outweighed if, when it does work, it prevents a war, battle, or incendiary police action. Reliably satisfying the ticking-time-bomb conditions is not necessary for such torture to make the world a better place. This is true whether we consider a particular imposition of torture or a general practice of using it.

On the deontological argument, Gordon's approach falls short. First, she cites a number of the arguments in the literature. She cites Shue's argument that torture is not a fair fight and that it is wrong to engage in war that is not a fair fight. She cites David Sussman's argument that torture is an egregious violation of the Kantian constraint requiring people to be treated as ends because it forces the victim to betray himself. And she cites Amartya Sen's argument that torture violates human rights.[4] There is no discussion of whether these arguments succeed and how they relate to one another. For example, Uwe Steinhoff pilloried the notion that morality in war requires of just combatants that they engage in a fair fight against their unjust opponents.[5]

More importantly, Gordon misses some important arguments in the literature. Specifically, Steinhoff and others have argued that in some cases interrogational torture is a form of defensive violence and thus can be justified in a way similar to ordinary self-defense.[6] The idea is defensive violence aims to prevent people who cause or enable an attack from completing it, and in some cases the torture victim is causing or enabling an unjust attack. A different but related view is that some terrorists forfeit their right against harm in virtue of their role in the ongoing unjust attack and thus the interrogational torture is not a right infringement. Because it is not wrong on other grounds (for example, exploitation, contempt, or unfairness), it is not wrong.[7] A third approach is that torture is a matter of fairness and that just as the trolley should be redirected toward the individual on the side track if he intentionally damaged the trolley's brakes thereby creating the danger, it is only fair that the terrorist bear the cost of disabling the bomb.[8] Regardless of whether these arguments succeed, Gordon does not discuss them.

Gordon's main argument is that because torture deforms the cardinal virtues, it diverts the quest for the good life and is thus a false practice. Let us grant this claim. It is unclear whether this shows that torture is wrong, bad, or vicious. Perhaps she is assuming that right acts are never vicious. She needs to be explicit here. In any case this view of rightness is not obvious. We often note that people did the right thing for a bad reason and the wrong thing for a good reason, and the virtue-based theory of rightness is not clearly compatible with this way of thinking.[9]

In addition, it is unclear whether the virtues with which she is concerned are those of individuals or society. It intuitively seems to be the former, but it is hard to see how intricacies of war-fighting policy have much of an impact on the virtue of most people. Perhaps it has a marginal effect on many people and a big effect on a small number, but then this is hard to square with the outage that so many people have toward the use of torture. In any case, if torture makes fewer people shoot and kill others as members of the infantry, then it is unclear whether this increases overall virtue even if done through vicious means.

In any case, Gordon's argument that torture deforms the virtues is unsuccessful. Consider justice (see 174-75). She argues that justice is the giving to people of what they are due and appropriately responding to their deprivations. Gordon argues that the U.S. use of torture is unjust because it is used to demonstrate guilt (because punishment precedes a trial), distorts the law, and conflates justice with vengeance. However, if the self-defense, forfeiture, or fairness accounts are true, then torture is just and, perhaps, permissible.

A more general problem with Gordon's argument is that it is unclear that the evaluation of the practice differs from the evaluation of isolated acts in that we still need to discuss whether instances of torture are always, mostly, or sometimes defensive, give people what they deserve, fair, infringe on the torture-victim's rights, etc. Invoking the virtue of justice does not allow Gordon to sidestep these messy deontology debates.

Even Gordon's model of virtue might be challenged. A rival view of virtue put forth by Thomas Hurka is that virtue consists of the love of the good and the hatred of evil and that vice is the opposite.[10] If this view is superior to the MacIntyre account, and I believe it is, then it is possible that the torturing agents, their superiors, and the citizens who put them in place are virtuous even if their acts are wrong and vicious. In any case, this would require an evaluation of people's mental states in a way that is different from how Gordon approaches the issue. It also requires consideration of whether torturers see themselves as doing a dirty but necessary job similar to how the Enola Gay crew viewed what they were doing. They might have been mistaken, but this does not make them vicious.

In summary, Gordon's approach is new, exciting, and ambitious. It attempts to evaluate interrogational torture via virtue ethics. Specifically, it evaluates it on the basis of MacIntyre's theory of virtue and practice. In the end, though, the book is unconvincing. It is unclear what Gordon is arguing for. Specifically, she needs to make it clear whether she is arguing that torture is wrong, bad, or vicious. Her discussion of the deontic literature is incomplete and in any case almost entirely uncritical. Her discussion of the way in which the U.S. practice of torture affects the cardinal virtues is unsuccessful. This is especially clear in the context of the virtue of justice.

[1] Specifically, she cites Alasdaire MacIntyre, After Virtue, 2nd ed. (Notre Dame, IN: Notre Dame University Press, 1984); Alasdair MacIntyre, Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (Notre Dame, IN: Notre Dame University Press, 1988).

[2] See CIA, Central Intelligence Agency Inspector General, "Special Review: Counterterrorism Detention and Interrogation Activities" (September 2001-October 2003), 7 May 2004. In the popular press, see Marc A. Thiessen, Courting Disaster: How the CIA Kept America Safe and How Barack Obama is Inviting the Next Attack (New York: Regnery, 2010).

[3] See Henry Shue, "Torture in Dreamland: Disposing of the Ticking Time Bomb." Case Western Journal of International Law 37 (2006): 231-239.

[4] See Henry Shue, "Torture," Philosophy and Public Affairs 7 (Spring 1978): 124-143; David Sussman, "What's Wrong with Torture?" Philosophy and Public Affairs 33 (2005): 1-33; David Sussman, "Defining Torture," Case Western Reserve Journal of International Law 37 (2006): 225-230; Amartya Sen, "Elements of a Theory of Moral Rights," Philosophy and Public Affairs 32 (2004): 315-356.

[5] See Uwe Steinhoff, "Torture -- The Case for Dirty Harry and against Alan Dershowitz." Journal of Applied Philosophy 23 (2006): 337-353.

[6] See Uwe Steinhoff, On the Ethics of Torture (Albany: SUNY Press, 2013).

[7] See Stephen Kershnar, For Torture: A Rights-Based Defense (Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2012) and Stephen Kershnar, "For Interrogational Torture," International Journal of Applied Philosophy 19 (2005): 223-241.

[8] See Michael Moore, "Torture and the Balance of Evils." Israel Law Review 23 (1989): 280-344.

[9] For the separation of motive and rightness, see W. D. Ross, The Right and the Good (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1988).

[10] See Thomas Hurka, "The Common Structure of Virtue and Desert." Ethics 112 (2001): 6-31 and Thomas Hurka, Virtue, Vice, and Value (New York: Oxford University Press, 2001).