Making Amends: Atonement in Morality, Law, and Politics

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Linda Radzik, Making Amends: Atonement in Morality, Law, and Politics, Oxford UP, 2009, 244pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195373660.

Reviewed by Cheshire Calhoun, Arizona State University



Linda Radzik’s Making Amends begins from this thought: “Our moral theories should tell us not just what is right and what is wrong but also how to deal with wrongdoing once it occurs” (3). Making Amends is an illuminating, elegantly written, and much-needed systematic treatment of the ethical obligations of wrongdoers.

The conceptual, if not textual, point of departure of this book is Radzik’s social conception of wrongdoing. Radzik asks: What do wrongs do? Her short answer is that they damage relationships - the relationship between wrongdoer and victim, between wrongdoer and the community, and between the wrongdoer and him or herself, as well as the victim’s relationship to both herself and her community. Wrongs damage relationships by sending the insulting and resentment-causing message that the victim is worth less than the wrongdoer - a message that may damage the victim’s self-trust and self-esteem, that may increase the likelihood of future harm if others believe that the victim is worth less, and that, if not countered, persists as a standing threat. What morality demands of wrongdoers is repair. Reclaiming and secularizing religious language, Radzik describes the activities of repair as acts of atonement having the goal of moral reconciliation of the parties in the damaged relationships (including the wrongdoer’s reconciliation with herself) and the wrongdoer’s redemption in the form of recovering her moral standing within the community.

The chapters following the introductory one fall into three pairs. Chapters two and three present and evaluate the two theories of atonement upon which Radzik’s own view is meant to be an improvement, namely, atonement as the repaying of a moral debt and atonement as repentant moral transformation. Chapters four and five develop her reconciliation theory of atonement. The last two chapters use the theory to defend a restorative conception of justice and to articulate the amends that can and should be made in response to collective wrongdoing.

One might think of atonement retributively as the self-infliction of punishment. Wrongdoers pay for their wrongdoing through painful feelings of guilt and remorse as well as through voluntarily imposed forms of suffering. Alternatively, one might think of atonement restitutively. Wrongdoers must pay restitution for the harms they cause.

Radzik rejects both retributive and restitutive conceptions of atonement. Against the former, Radzik argues that the condemnation-expressing and responsibility-accepting functions of (self)punishment can be served just as well by apologies and repentance. Moreover, it is not the punishingly painful aspects of guilt and remorse that make these emotions important to atonement; rather, guilt and remorse matter because of the attitudes and moral beliefs associated with these emotions. Finally, retributive views are insufficiently victim-centered. Restitutive views are not an improvement. In focusing on compensating the victim for harm, restitutive conceptions of atonement lose sight of the wrongdoer. If all that matters is victim compensation, then compensation by third parties rather than the atoning guilty party would do just as well. Moreover, not all of the damages caused by wrongdoing are compensable. Radzik writes, “Trust, friendship, community, self-esteem, health, life, a sense of security, and a feeling of wholeness are all valuable things that, once damaged or destroyed cannot simply be repaid or compensated” (54). A different sort of reparative response is needed.

If the goal of atoning isn’t to repay a debt, perhaps it is instead to effect a moral transformation. Radzik explores a variety of options for what must be transformed — the wrongdoer’s identity, his future behavior, his commitment to morality (either by adopting better values or by more perfectly adhering to the moral values he has), and the significance of the past wrongful deed. Although Radzik agrees that most of these sorts of moral transformation have some place in a satisfactory theory of atonement, she argues that we need an account of the importance of moral transformation that is not so focused on the wrongdoer. In particular, we need some account of the role that moral transformation plays in repairing the damage done to the victim and the victim’s relationship to the wrongdoer.

The reconciliation theory of atonement that Radzik defends places the repair of relationships at center stage and attempts to capture the complexity of an appropriate response to wrongdoing. While wrongdoing does damage personal relationships, it is the damage to moral relationships that morality requires us to repair. Persons are obligated to maintain a moral relationship with others, where this means both regarding others as equally morally valuable and being morally trustworthy in one’s treatment of others. In violating legitimately authoritative norms, the wrongdoer sends the message that she does not recognize the victim’s equal value and she shows herself to be morally untrustworthy. The wrongdoer thereby lowers her moral standing in the eyes of her victim and often third parties as well. The victim now has reason to structure their relationship in terms of the roles of wrongdoer and victim.

Radzik distinguishes three goals of atonement: moral improvement so that one makes oneself a morally trustworthy person, communication with the victim and/or community in a way that withdraws the original insulting message, and reparation of harms done to the victim. In accomplishing the three subgoals of atonement, there will be a place for feelings of remorse and guilt, repentance, reparation payments, private and public apologies, service work for parties other than the victim, and even self-punishment to the extent this self-punishment is useful in effecting moral transformation and sending a remorseful message to others.

The overarching goal of atoning acts, however, is moral reconciliation — that is, providing the victim and/or the victim’s community with reason to stop structuring their relationship in terms of the wrongdoer-victim roles, to cease regarding the wrongdoer with suspicion, and to once again view the wrongdoer as a person in good moral standing who is now morally trustworthy with respect to what she had previously shown herself to be untrustworthy. To recover one’s good moral standing is to be redeemed.

The two chapters in which Radzik develops her reconciliation theory of atonement are enormously rich and thought-provoking. To my mind, chapter five is both the most interesting and the most controversial. The discussion in that chapter is driven by the following worry: If the aim of atoning acts is actual moral reconciliation — that is, ceasing to be regarded by others with moral distrust — then the wrongdoer’s redemption will depend on the receptiveness of the victim (and the community). Given her social conception of wrongdoing as behavior that damages actual moral relationships, Radzik needs an equally social conception of successful atonement as the actual repair of those relationships. But she also does not want the moral wrongdoer’s redemption to be held hostage by victims who maliciously or hard-heartedly refuse to reconcile. She makes two moves to avoid this conclusion.

Toward the end of chapter five, Radzik argues that, should victims wrongfully refuse to reconcile with the wrongdoer after a thoroughgoing atonement, wrongdoers may consider themselves redeemed in the absence of actual moral reconciliation. Here I don’t see why Radzik doesn’t just bite her own bullet. Having conceived of wrongdoing in terms of actual damage to relationships and moral standing in terms of the actual respect one receives from others, why not hold that one is redeemed only when the participants in one’s actual social practice of morality reaccept one as a trustworthy member of the moral community? In imperfect worlds, redemption may just be hard to come by — and hard to come by through no fault of wrongdoers who do all they are required to do to make up for their past actions.

The more significant and interestingly argued move that Radzik makes in order to avoid making wrongdoers’ redemption “unacceptably vulnerable to their victims” is to argue that victims are typically obligated to morally reconcile upon full atonement (125). Radzik’s first argument for victims’ duty to reconcile is, in brief, this: The benefits of social cooperation are enormous. Social cooperation depends on trust. Furthermore, “A moral system that provides a road back from wrongdoing to trustworthiness will be generally beneficial” (131). Therefore, victims ought to accept evidence of trustworthiness that falls short of conclusive evidence. Her second argument appeals to respect for the wrongdoer’s moral agency: To impede a wrongdoer’s efforts to atone (e.g., by refusing to hear an apology) and/or to refuse to morally reconcile after a thoroughgoing atonement is to disrespect the wrongdoer’s agency and treat him or her as someone who is incapable of moral transformation. Victims wrong the wrongdoer if they do not allow amends to be made and if they do not morally reconcile once amends have been fully made.

Both arguments strike me as generally correct. Still, one might resist the conclusion that victims are obligated, upon full atonement, to trust the former wrongdoer with respect to the very matter on which she was previously untrustworthy. Moral trust is scalar as are good will and moral competence. We may owe everyone, in the absence of evidence of untrustworthiness, some minimal level of moral trust. Further, we may owe fully atoning wrongdoers a general trust in their goodwill, their capacity to recognize authoritative norms, and their willingness to accept responsibility and make amends if they err in the future. We do not, however, owe it to everyone to trust them with our personal information, door keys, pets and the like. Atonement for betrayal cannot make it the case that we now owe a level of moral trust that wasn’t owed in the first place. At most, it seems to me, victims are obligated to acknowledge that the wrongdoer has done all she should have to make amends and that some kind of moral reconciliation is in order.

The problem is that Radzik’s conception of moral reconciliation does not appear to allow the victim and wrongdoer to recalibrate their trust relation; the two reconcile only if they return to the same trust relation they once had. This doesn’t seem right. One way that wrongdoers atone and prove themselves trustworthy for the future is by ceasing to ask for certain forms of trust — for example, one doesn’t ask to share the confidences of someone whose confidence one has betrayed in the past. Also, one way that victims find a road back to trust is to limit the opportunities for betrayal. To be fair, Radzik does insist that “redemption, the restoration of moral standing, moral reconciliation, forgiveness, and self-forgiveness come in degrees” and that moral reconciliation is an ideal (151). So she might say that the recalibrated trust relations I have in mind are cases of partial reconciliation and redemption — and a partial discharge of victims’ duty to reconcile. My worry, however, is that Radzik’s view overburdens victims with an obligation to return to a pre-betrayal level of trust upon full atonement.

In chapter 6, Radzik takes up restorative justice. Because restorative justice approaches to criminal sentencing promote the three subgoals of atonement — communication between victim and wrongdoer, reparation, and moral transformation — Radzik generally favors restorative justice approaches, though she argues for procedural safeguards to ensure that sentencing agreements do not reflect unreasonable conceptions of the good or unequal condemnation of equivalent crimes.

The last chapter takes up an historical case introduced in chapter 1 — the Magdalen asylums for “fallen” women in Ireland in the 19th and 20th centuries. The Magdalen asylums imposed especially harsh and degrading forms of atonement, exploited the penitents’ labor in unpaid laundry work, and made exit from the asylum difficult. The central question Radzik explores in this chapter is whether present day members of a collective (in this case, the Catholic Church in Ireland) are obligated make amends for wrongs they did not commit.

Linda Radzik’s Making Amends is a superb philosophical investigation of the moral aftermath of wrongdoing. In taking up such a critical area of morality, Radzik makes a significant contribution to ethics.