Making Babies: Is There a Right to Have Children?

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Warnock, Mary, Making Babies: Is There a Right to Have Children?, Oxford University Press, 2002, 126pp, $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 0192803344.

Reviewed by Anthony Ellis , Virginia Commonwealth University


Despite the subtitle of the book, Baroness Warnock’s question is not whether there is a right to have children. Her question is rather whether those who cannot conceive—the infertile or homosexual couples for example—have a right to assistance in conceiving so long as they can pay for it. (She does not address the further question of whether some at least of them have a right to such assistance without paying.) Her answer, somewhat qualified, is that they do, or—since she professes not to believe in natural rights—at least that they ought to be allowed to obtain it.

Baroness Warnock has been a substantial figure in British public life for some years now. In particular, she chaired the Committee of Enquiry into Human Fertilisation and Embryology, whose report was the basis for legislation in the United Kingdom in 1990 (and on whose deliberations some interesting sidelights are included in the book). Consequently, many of those who are not familiar with her more centrally philosophical work—she has written on ethics, aesthetics and existentialism, for instance—will be familiar with her style: bluff common sense expressed in a bluff, straightforward prose. Whatever else one may think of Warnock’s work it is, superficially anyway, a delight to read; and this book is no exception.

The subtitle is—perhaps—misleading in another way, for, as I have said, Warnock claims to think that there are no such things as rights unless they are embodied in the positive law: “that unless there is a law conferring a right no right can exist … is a view to which, unfashionably, I, on the whole, adhere” (p. 19). She dislikes the notion of natural rights partly because it has promoted a rhetoric of whining individualism, and one can only sympathize with her here. She also dislikes the idea that the doctor-patient relationship should be based on rights and correlative duties rather than on the “paternalistic” compassion that a good doctor has for his patients, though this will elicit far less sympathy. But of course none of this goes any way towards showing that there are no such things as natural rights, a view which I myself think desperately implausible unless it is part of a general skepticism about morality. Warnock thinks that the notion of natural rights is a confusion and that anything worth saying about morality can be said without the vocabulary of rights, but I doubt this. She says that anyone objecting to slavery, for instance, would be “asserting that slave-owners had a moral duty to free their slaves” (p. 22). No doubt; but they would typically also be asserting that the slave-owners had a duty to the slaves, not just in respect of the slaves, to free them, and that is quite different and at least equally important. It would bring with it, for instance, questions of individual compensation which the original claim would not. And with such a thought we are well on the way to a conception of natural rights. Of course, one could hold that the slave-owners had two duties, one to free the slaves and the other to compensate them. But this would surely be to hang on to the substance of natural rights whilst letting go of the patter, because the only plausible reason to think that the slave-owner should compensate the slaves would be that he has wronged them and they have a claim to redress. Certainly, a calculation of general welfare could not be guaranteed to deliver this duty. And an appeal to the slave-owner’s virtue could not do so unless it appealed to the virtue of giving people their due (failure to compensate could hardly be viewed simply as meanness, for instance); but what would that mean without a doctrine of rights?

In any case, soon after proclaiming her rejection of natural rights (“on the whole”), Warnock seems to backtrack a little. On pp. 24ff. she seems to come round to the view that there are indeed natural rights, based upon basic need, and she indeed addresses the question whether, so long as one can pay for it, there is a natural right to have assistance in procreation. Whether, as I imagine, this is merely a compromise with fashion for the sake of getting on with the substance of the argument, or a somewhat parochial response to the fact that, as Warnock remarks and deplores, United Kingdom law now recognizes the notion of ’human rights’, I am not entirely sure.

The substance of the argument seems to be settled rather soon. However strongly people may want to have children, there is no “basic need” to have them (p. 27) and so no natural right. It is not, however, until p. 54 that this conclusion is explicitly stated, and Warnock proceeds instead, somewhat confusingly to me at least, to discuss and reject the argument that there is no such right because there cannot be “a right to do what is morally wrong” (p. 30), and assistance in procreation involves experimentation on embryos, which is itself morally wrong. She rejects this last claim—mainly because, so far as I can see, “generally people have now come to take [experimentation on pre-fourteen-day, live human embryos] for granted, and moreover to regard it as something that has enormous potential for” good (p. 36). Still, despite this defense of the possibility of a natural right to assistance in procreation, the conclusion of the earlier argument stands: there is no such right. Unsurprisingly however, given Warnock’s skepticism about rights, the question is transformed and resurrected: should the infertile who wish it nonetheless be allowed to have assistance in procreation? Her answer is, basically, that they should—both morally and legally—and they are “entitled to expect that they will be given it” (p. 54)—a way of putting the matter which barely, if at all, avoids conceding that they have a right to it (the entitlement in question could hardly be epistemic in this particular context).

The discussion so far has concerned the infertile. But fertile people sometimes want ’assistance in procreation’ too. Women, not wishing to give up their careers, may wish to bank sperm and later be artificially inseminated; or a couple may wish to choose between different eggs when normal procreation would involve a high chance of producing a seriously diseased child; Warnock sees nothing problematic about these cases. Nor, sensibly, does she see anything wrong with parents who wish to have a child through IVF if this is necessary to produce a child with bone marrow compatible with that of a sibling in urgent need of it, for the child may nonetheless be loved for its own sake. Homosexuals who wish to have children are given more discussion, but again she can see nothing intrinsically wrong with this and thinks that, like the infertile, they should be allowed to obtain such procedures as AI or surrogacy.

Warnock thinks that much of the resistance to such things comes from two fears: One is that “[w]ith divine law removed, the laws of nature seem more than ever necessary, a prop to cling to” (p. 79). The other stems from the Romantic view that we are “alienating ourselves from what ought to be our dwelling, from the place where we want to be at home” (p. 82). But however much we should respect these fears, they are, she thinks, a poor ground for denying people something that they desperately want.

Surrogacy seems to trouble her a little more, mainly because it is “liable to end in tears” (p. 90). When she chaired the Committee of Enquiry into Human Fertilisation and Embryology, she also thought that commercial surrogacy was exploitative (at least as it existed in the US at that time) and vulgarized the business of childbirth (p. 89). It is unclear whether she is still committed to these views (though I suspect that she still has some sympathy with the latter—cf. p. 91f.); but in any case she now favors an official, non-profit surrogacy agency because surrogacy will go on anyway and it is better if it is regulated.

Cloning she thinks “should never be allowed” (p. 108), apparently because there is a fundamental moral objection to it: “It suggests a false idea of the control that one person may [permissibly?] have over another” (ibid.).

The book is, despite a somewhat confusing structure, a pleasant read; it gives useful, brief descriptions of some factual and legal matters; and it contains more sound common sense about moral matters than is usual in this area. But it is in the end rather disappointing, because, at this point in time, the issue demands considerably more sustained philosophical argument than Warnock gives. As it is, there is little appeal to anything deeper than commonly held moral beliefs.

Here is one example. Discussing the question of whether doctors may permissibly deny assistance in procreation to prospective parents whom they deem unsuitable on non-clinical grounds, Warnock says this:

[t]he principle has been enunciated, and is indeed included in the 1990 Fertility and Embryology Act, as well as in the guiding principles under that Act, that the good of the child is paramount. Yet what exactly this principle means, what force it has, and how the child’s future good is to be estimated have not been seriously examined, nor did we on the Committee examine such issues. The principle sounded good, and we adopted it. (p. 45)

The general meaning of the principle seems clear when the question is, for instance, whether children conceived through AID should be told of this fact (p. 64 ff.). It is, of course, considerably less clear when the question is whether or not a child is to be conceived or not. When the prospective parents of the potential child would somehow make his or her life worse than no life at all, it may seem plausible to claim that it would not be ’for the good of the child’ to be born. But that is a vanishingly rare sort of case in the context of assisted procreation. More commonly, the prospective parents are simply, for instance, relatively old, or disabled in some way; or they may have a history of child abuse. It is not plausible to say in such cases that the life of the potential child would be no better than no life at all, so that it would not be for the good of the child to be born. So, understood in this way, the ’good of the child’ principle will have no real application. Perhaps, then, it is to be understood in some other way? Perhaps the thought is that one should not bring into existence a child unless the quality of its life surpasses some threshold (though it would be misleading to announce this as the principle that “the good of the child is paramount”). But then the nature of this threshold, and its motivation, cry out for discussion—and cry out with particular force in a book devoted to the question whether there is a right to have assistance in procreation. Warnock, however, is content simply to report that her Committee did not bother to discuss the principle; it sounded good.

Professor Sir Malcolm MacNaughton tells us on the back cover that the book is “[e]ssential reading for all”. It certainly has the virtues that we have come to expect from Baroness Warnock. And a book on this topic from someone who has been so involved in this issue in British public life has its own interest, for British readers at least. But I do not think that it could really be regarded as essential reading.