Making Communism Hermeneutical: Reading Vattimo and Zabala

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Silvia Mazzini and Owen Glyn-Williams (eds.), Making Communism Hermeneutical: Reading Vattimo and Zabala, Springer, 2017, 261pp., $119.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319590196.

Reviewed by Martin G. Weiss, University of Klagenfurt


In response to the contribution of Silvia Mazzini, one of this book's editors, Vattimo and Zabala write: "The simple presence of the Soviet Union and communist parties were viewed not only as the possibility of another world, but also of a simple alternative which is missing in the West now" (p.126). Born in 1973, I still remember a double page of my West German history schoolbook containing a schematic comparison of the political systems of the Federal Republic of Germany and the German Democratic Republic. Although the book suggested that capitalist Germany was more democratic than its communist sibling (despite its disguising denomination), what also stayed in my mind was a different order of "words and things", that was not only possible but worked so well it posed a threat to capitalist societies.

With the fall of the Berlin Wall and the thoroughgoing victory of capitalism over communism, capitalism has imposed itself as the only possible, i.e. necessary, (Lacanian) "Real". Capitalism today is conceived as a condition without alternatives not just because capitalism (as orthodox communism did) conceives of the economy, not as a human-made tool, originally created to emancipate humanity from the burden of Nature, but as a natural fact reigned over by unchangeable natural laws, which by definition cannot be challenged, only described. Accordingly, capitalism is no more the subject of politics, understood with Hannah Arendt as the open space of negotiation and conversation about what we conceive of as "the good life", but the subject of a natural science called economics.

According to capitalist ideology this science allegedly simply "describes" objective facts that can be mirrored by "true" propositions. As capitalism conforms to the natural laws of economics, it is as "true" as the facts on which it relies. And as there are no such thing as justifying facts, only explaining them, capitalism itself cannot be justified: hence, this is the end not just of politics, but of democracy.

Prima facie, Gianni Vattimo's and Santiago Zabala's Hermeneutic Communism: From Heidegger to Marx, published in 2011, challenges this naturalization of capitalism by surprisingly challenging the naturalization of communism. But on closer inspection, Vattimo and Zabala argue that if the major flaw of capitalism consists in its metaphysical objectivism, i.e. its claim to be the only economic and political order compatible with factual reality, then any political alternative cannot claim for itself the same objectivity but must be of an "hermeneutic" nature. This means that it does not claim to be "unconfutable" and objectively "true", but only to be a possible alternative, maybe better, response to the problems humanity is facing.

The present collection of 17 essays contains a number of critical, in part, replies to Vattimo and Zabala's accounts of both capitalism and communism, as well as short responses by the authors of Hermeneutic Communism. Given the limitations of space here, I will focus this review on a few of the key arguments that recur throughout the volume.

Eduardo Mendieta categorizes Vattimo and Zabala's book as a typical "Manifesto". It elaborates on the hermeneutic understanding of interpretation as a creative act insofar as every interpretation changes not only its object be it a text or the world we live in, but also the interpreter herself: "Hermeneutics is a praxis that transforms us, others, our worlds, our forms of life" (p. 11), or, as Jeffrey W. Robbins puts it: "Interpretation is a political act" (p. 66).

The question Mendieta poses to Vattimo and Zabala in this regard concerns a major problem of hermeneutics as a form of radical immanentism: On what basis can we distinguish between better (more productive) and worse interpretations? Unfortunately, Vattimo and Zabala fail to give a response to Mendieta's question: "Mandieta's reference to our call for 'productive interpretations' does not require a response, as he agrees with our characterization of hermeneutics as a radical and emancipatory thought" (p. 17).

In an interview some years ago, Vattimo offered criteria for a better interpretation of reality and history when the only thing we have is reality and history, i.e. when we have lost faith in an objective truth beyond the "Lebenswelt (Life-world)" we are living in. He suggested that his rejection of strong truths was the result of the most convincing interpretation of history itself.

According to Vattimo, history (of philosophy) itself points at the end of truth:

It is possible to identify a trend in history which leads more in one direction than in another. If I say that tradition produced Voltaire as well as the Jesuits of the 18th century, I have to reason to decide whom I prefer. It is possible to identify a trend in history which leads more in one direction than in another, but this trend is no fact to which I must subject myself. It is only an interpretation which I suggest, but this does not mean that therefore it is worth less. . . . I'm convinced that it is possible to persuade that my 'weak thought' is preferable to positivistic empiricism, but I do not possess a conclusive empirical argument for this claim.[1]

More convincing is Vattimo and Zabala's response to Jeff and Nick Malpas, which favors a strong concept of eternal truth. They argue that truth is not the basis but the end of politics, understood as the space of open "conversation", because the appeal to truth ends all discussions and is therefore an act of violence. It is not an accident that allegedly justified violence is always perpetrated in the name of truth, be it God's truth as in the case of religious bigotry, or the truths of Nature as in the case of racism, or even those of Emancipation, as Vattimo and Zabala stress in their response to the contribution of Peg Birmingham: "After all, even such emancipatory and revolutionary ideals as those of 1789 and 1848 (which Birmingham sees close to the ideal motivating our weakened communism) have been imposed violently, as we've seen in recent wars" (p. 64). Thus for Vattimo and Zabala politics, the conversation about what "good life" looks like, is possible only inside Plato's cave.

Several contributions examine the philosophies on which Vattimo and Zabala base their position. Although the subtitle of Hermeneutic Communism, "From Heidegger to Marx", may suggest these two thinkers are of equal influence, different contributors emphasize the extent to which the book owes more to Heidegger, and even Husserl (see the contribution of Michael Marder), than to Marx. Jeffrey W. Robbins, who here relies on the work of Catherine Malabou, agrees with Vattimo and Zabala that Heidegger's philosophy, albeit not Heidegger the man, can inspire an alternative to capitalism, insofar as it repudiates every notion of metaphysical immutability, reaffirming the condition of possibility of Marx's famous demand not only to interpret, but to change the world (forgetting however that interpreting is already changing). Robbins summarizes the main point of Heidegger's (allegedly intrinsically anti-capitalist) philosophy, as Vattimo and Zabala understand it, as follows:

There is nothing that cannot change. More, there is nothing that is not change, that is not always already changed and changing. This is the strongest repudiation of the very ideology of capitalism that renders capitalism as completely natural and inevitable, and thus, irresistible. (p. 70)

Babette Babich explains:

It is precisely for the sake of such challenges that we need hermeneutics: contra the dictates of analytic philosophy which only inscribe what it calls realist thinking (or what it calls 'critical thinking') as this corresponds to the received theory of whatever ruling class there happens to be, whether in society or the academy, which always reduces to the terms of conventionally institutionalized science. (p. 97)

In their critical chapter, Lucas Ross Perkins and Michael Allen Gillespie blame Vattimo and Zabala for only offering a critique of metaphysical objectivism, and capitalism as its correspondent economic and political order, without formulating a convincing alternative beneath their, admittedly odd, invocation of the Venezuelan model of socialism:

To put it as succinctly as possible, we think that weak thought is at its most powerful and poignant when it restricts itself to the metaphysical realm, that is, when it seeks to inspire us to become a particular type of being and to interact with others in a spirit of patience and deference and to rein in our all-too-human tendencies to hold the products of our finite cognition as truth and our contingent ways of being as law. Weak thought holds that a non-violent way of being in the world -- non-violent in all senses of the world -- is the only one that is consistent with our weakness and finitude. (p. 148)

Vattimo and Zabala's odd faith in charismatic South American leaders (odd not only in light of today's knowledge) is addressed not only by Perkins and Gillespie but also by Owen Glyn-Williams, the other editor of this volume, who asks why Vattimo and Zabala connect their concept of a hermeneutic communism with patriarchal figures, traditional parties and forms of state-socialism and not with more anarchic movements of civil societies. Actually this discussion goes back to -- on the one hand -- Walter Benjamin's, Foucault's and Agamben's anarchic identification of politics with a kind of sovereign power over life and death that is opposed to the private sphere of the individual and -- on the other hand -- Hannah Arendt's position which identifies politics with the public sphere of free conversation as opposed to the violent realm of the private where one is subjected to the sovereign power of the pater familias. With this distinction in mind, it becomes clear that Vattimo and Zabala's Hermenutic Communism is not anarchic and individualistic but shares the classical socialist view of the state as the legitimate representative of the collective will and a feasible means to achieve the good life for everybody. This also explains their opposition to an (anarchic) revolution, which according to Vattimo and Zabala would not put the weak in power, but only destroy any (state) order: "As Zizek says, the biggest problem with a revolution is not the event in itself, but rather the morning after" (p. 261).

Although the responses of Vattimo and Zabala to the contributions mainly consist of summaries of the respective papers and repetitions of arguments already outlined in Hermeneutic Communism, the volume nevertheless offers an excellent critical introduction to Vattimo and Zabala' political thinking as well as providing elements for a more general analysis and critique of capitalism, which was also Marx's aim. Like Vattimo and Zabala, and the authors of Making Communism Hermeneutical, Marx had much to say about capitalism, but little to offer about what a future communist society might look like. This task is still open, although Marx offers a hint (also for critical reviewers):

In communist society, where nobody has one exclusive sphere of activity but each can become accomplished in any branch he wishes, society regulates the general production and thus makes it possible for me to do one thing today and another tomorrow, to hunt in the morning, fish in the afternoon, rear cattle in the evening, criticize after dinner, just as I have a mind, without ever becoming hunter, fisherman, herdsman or critic.[2]

[1] Weiss, Martin G. & Vattimo, Gianni: Die Stärken des schwachen Denkens. Ein Gespräch mit Gianni Vattimo. In: Weiss, Martin G.: Gianni Vattimo. Einführung. Wien. Passagen 2012, pp. 171-182, here p. 175.

[2] Marx, Karl & Engels, Friedrich: Die deutsche Ideologie. Werke 3. Berlin. Dietz 1966, p. 33.