Making Objects and Events: A Hylomorphic Theory of Artifacts, Actions, and Organisms

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Simon J. Evnine, Making Objects and Events: A Hylomorphic Theory of Artifacts, Actions, and Organisms, Oxford University Press, 2016, 268pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198779674.

Reviewed by Lynne Rudder Baker, University of Massachusetts Amherst


In the increasingly crowded field of the metaphysics of ordinary things, Simon J. Evnine has written a superb book. It is detailed, profound, and carefully argued, with extremely well-informed discussions of views that have a bearing on his own account. Evnine is careful to make clear the relevance of many different issues to each other.

The book is impressive in scope. Evnine formulates a hylomorphic account of artifacts (including artworks), and adapts it to organisms and actions (artifactual events). He discusses natural non-organic objects (like rivers, stars, and rocks), which he takes not to be genuine objects, and develops a fictionalist account of discourse about them. Along the way, he discusses vagueness, mereology, three- and four-dimensionalism, ontological minimalism, disjunctivism, variable embodiment, mass production, teleology, functions, qua objects, prototypes, ready-mades, and more. He even gives a satisfying solution to the puzzle of the Ship of Theseus. Since such an array of topics is far too much for a review, I'll focus on Evnine's general conception of hylomorphism, and his hylomorphic treatment of artifacts (his paradigms of hylomorphism) and organisms.

Evnine begins by proposing a minimal but sufficient condition for a view's being a version of hylomorphism as he construes it:

(HYL) Some things stand in the relation of being the matter of to other things and this relation (the matter relation) is irreflexive and asymmetric. (3)

He then surveys some views that satisfy this condition and are thus hylomorphic -- views of Judith Jarvis Thomson, Lynne Rudder Baker, and Kit Fine, whose dense work is treated in detail -- and raises problems for each of them. Before turning to his own view, he considers Aristotle's matter and form. Many contemporary hylomorphists (the principle-based hylomorphists) follow Aristotle, but substitute some "principle, property, relation, function or structure" for form. Evnine's version of hylomorphism also abandons form, or any substitute that plays the role of form for Aristotle. He builds hylomorphic structure "on the basis of the intertwinings between the functions and characteristic behaviors of things, what those things essentially are and how they come to exist." (254) Noting the terminological awkwardness of a hylomorphism without the morphe, he calls his version 'amorphic hylomorphism.'

Although he gives up Aristotelian form, Evnine follows Aristotle in recognizing multiple causes. Aristotle says that efficient, formal and final causes "often coincide." (8) Hylomorphically complex entities have matter which has been acted upon by tightly connected formal, efficient and final causes associated with the kind under which the complex entity falls.

Hylomorphically complex entities on Evnine's view are sui generis entities with matter that can change over time. (12) Evnine accommodates this feature by what he calls 'having a metabolism' -- the ability to change matter over time and across worlds. We can think of the "metabolism" of a gold ring as a rule that determines what the ring's matter is at any time and in any possible world. The rule can be thought of as a function by which the "object 'selects' its matter rather than being determined by it." (16) Hylomorphically complex entities "are not the particular objects they are because they have the matter they do; rather, they have the matter they do because they are the objects they are." (17)

Evnine advocates both "the methodological priority of matter to complex object," and as a metaphysical issue, "the metabolic priority of complex object to matter." (13-16) The methodological priority of matter to hylomorphically complex entity accounts for the entity's hylomorphic structure. The way that hylomorphic structure arises (at least for artifacts and actions) is "through the intentional imposition of mind on matter that constitutes making one thing out of another." (211)

The metabolic priority of complex object to matter has two kinds of significance: First, the metabolic priority of complex object to matter accounts for the nonidentity of the hylomorphically complex object to its matter. (14). Not only can hylomorphically complex objects survive change in the matter that they are made of, but also they could have been made of different matter. So, they are both temporally and modally flexible with respect to their matter. Second, the metabolic priority of complex object to matter guarantees that the nature of hylomorphically complex objects is not determined from the "bottom up," not determined by their parts; rather, their parts are determined by the metabolisms of the hylomorphically complex objects. (196)

In a further contrast to Aristotle, Evnine gives center stage to artifacts as paradigms of hylomorphically complex objects. (18) Artifacts differ from other hylomorphically complex entities in that they are things intentionally made: beings with intentions take some things and make something else out of them. The "identity of an artifact is essentially dependent on the act by which it was brought into existence." (21) Actions themselves are hylomorphically complex entities -- artifactual events. (21, 207)

In a nutshell, Evnine's theory of material-object artifacts is: Artifacts depend on minds for their existence. What it is to be such an artifact is "to be the impress of a mind on matter," through the process of "working on the matter with certain intentions." (69-70) For example, a sand castle may be made by a child out of some sand: the sand castle exists in virtue of the child's intentional activity of manipulating the sand. In this case, the making instantiates the matter relation -- the bringing into existence of an object (the sand castle) that has another object (the quantity of sand) as its matter. The child's activity of making and the instantiation of the matter relation are "two sides of the same coin." (70)

Artifacts come into existence by "someone's working with certain intentions on some material that becomes the artifact's matter." Some kinds -- sonnet and arrowhead -- are artifact kinds, all of whose members are artifacts. (67) The important factor in an artifact's being the thing that it is is the act by which it was produced. Evnine distinguishes two 'necessity of origins' theses: necessity of origin-as-matter and necessity of origin-as-act. He argues for both for the necessity and sufficiency of origin-as-act.

Evnine first argues for the sufficiency of origin-as-act. It is because of the nature of artifacts, "as the impositions of minds onto matter, that a given act of, say, table making determines the identity of the table produced by it." (96) The object created is not just table-shaped matter, but rather what he calls an "ideal object, the result of the creative intention projecting itself, externalizing itself, through the material medium. As such, the identity of the act is sufficient for the identity of the product." (96) Given the sufficiency of origin-as-act, he then argues for the necessity of origin-as-act, by adapting premises for the thesis of the necessity of origin-as-matter. (96)

Since not every artifact is the result of a particular, well-formulated creative intention, Evnine turns to facts of mass production. If artifacts of the same kind -- say, widgets made by a single act of operating a machine opening nozzles that release molten steel -- results in the creation of 100 widgets all at once, then they have a collective essence, not "individual essences that fix what is possible or necessary for them beyond what is fixed for them by the plurality to which they belong." (98) Instead of the concurrent creation of widgets, suppose the widgets were made consecutively; widget molds were on a conveyor belt, and each worker pressed a button filling a mold as it passed in front of her. Would the widgets in this case -- each one individually made -- then have individual essences? No, says Evnine. Each assembly line worker's pressing a button is not a genuinely creative act; "The worker's mind is not the one impressing itself on to the matter." (99) Indeed, the intentional elements of an act of making may be distributed among a number of people. As a result the objects produced have no individual essences that distinguishes one from another within the plurality.

Evnine's hylomorphic theory also applies to abstract artifacts, like musical works, fictional characters, and language (the three kinds that Evnine discusses). For example, a musical work is a hylomorphically complex artifact that has a sound structure as its matter. It comes to exist when a composer works on a sound structure with a creative intention of making a musical composition. A fictional character is set of properties (in the role of matter) attributed to the character, selected by the creative intention of the author. Since, as we saw with material hylomorphic entities, the identity of such an entity is not fixed by its matter, the identity of musical works and fictional characters is not fixed by the (sets of) properties that play the role of matter in abstract entities. Again, on Evnine's view, the identity of hylomorphic abstract artifacts like musical works and fictional characters is fixed by the creative intentions of the composer or author.

The last sort of artifact that Evnine discusses is action. Actions are artifactual events. Evnine draws on views about events and actions of Fine, Jaegwon Kim/Alvin Goldman and Donald Davidson to develop his own hylomorphic view. Although for actions, there is no act of making as there is for artifactual objects, there is "an intention to perform an action of a given type in a certain way" and this intention is of the same kind "that would be operative if there were an action of making one out of the other." (244) The act of making (for an artifactual objects) is replaced by "the intention with which [the action] is performed." (245) I can only sketch one simple example: When an agent flips the switch by moving her finger, there are two actions -- the switch-flipping and the intentional movement of the finger. The agent intends to bring into existence an action of switch-flipping by intentionally moving her finger; the matter of the action of switch-flipping is the intentional movement of the finger. (220)

The matter of a higher-level action (e.g., turning on the light) is a lower-level action (e.g., a switch-flipping). The action hierarchy bottoms out in basic actions. A basic action is a qua object that has a bodily movement as its basis and the property of being intentional as its (essential) gloss. (221) So, assuming that the matter of a basic action is a bodily movement, actions fit into the hylomorphic schema of working on some matter (the intention to do something) that brings into existence something else (an action). Just as the essence of "artifactual objects derive from that actions by which they are made," so too do the "essences of actions derive from the intentions with which they are performed." (245)

Let me turn now to organisms. Evnine holds that the account of artifacts can be adapted to include organisms, "owing to the similarities between the intentional creation of artifacts and the evolution of organisms." (188) In the case of artifacts, we have an agent, matter, and an intentional act by which the agent works on the matter. In the case of (human) organisms, the sperm and egg are the agents; assuming that the agents are essential to the act, fertilization plays the role of the intentional act. Fertilization destroys the sperm and egg, but some of their molecules intermingle to produce a new cell. So the sperm and egg are agents that jointly make a new cell by supplying the matter (their molecules) for it. The new cell divides, but "it seems plausible to say that something that the sperm and egg have brought into existence continues to exist as the cell divides, and the successors, in turn, divide." (170) What they bring into existence is a hylomorphic object that can survive changes in its matter; indeed, according to Evnine, it is a human organism.

However, this hylomorphic account leads to a problem about identity conditions for organisms. As we have seen, Evnine takes what is essential to the identity an organism to be the act by which brought it into existence: on his hylomorphic view, the act of fertilization. At the end of fertilization, he supposes, there is an organism, O. (170-1) Suppose that O "twins". In that case, instead of one organism, there are two organisms with only one creative act, one fertilization. Evnine recognizes this difficulty, and responds to it by treating twinning as analogous to mass production: in the case of the twins, there is just a collective essence, no individual essence. So, the twins do not have individual essences; instead, like mass-produced widgets, they only share a collective essence. Now suppose that the twins have a brother (the result of a different act of fertilization) who is not a twin. The first worry is that a theory on which some people (the brother) have individual essences and others do not (the twins) strains credulity.

But credulity aside, there's a deeper problem. Suppose that the original product of fertilization had "twinned" after several divisions, and split into two individuals. Before the twin-producing split, what resulted from a single act would have been the single organism with an individual essence. But after the split, there are two individuals resulting from the single act of fertilization with a collective essence. If the original product of fertilization had been an organism, this would be outright incoherent: the result of a single creative act cannot have an individual essence at one time and (after twinning) have a collective essence.

Evnine responds to this worry by supposing that there are two kinds of acts -- fertilizations and splittings -- that give rise to organisms. But in the case of splitting, there already is an organism, which splits to produce two organisms. This doesn't seem to work hylomorphically. What is the agent in the case of splitting? What is the matter? How does the agent work on the matter to produce another organism? Monozygotic twinning seems unique. I do not see how any artifactual phenomena are even remotely analogous the biological phenomena involved in twinning. So, I am dubious about extending Evnine's hylomorphic account from artifacts to organisms.

Moreover, contrary to what Evnine says, the initial result of fertilization cannot be an organism, or any enduring individual that may develop into an infant. Suppose that, as Evnine has it, at the end of fertilization, an "organism," O, came into existence. Suppose further that after several divisions, O twins; then there are O1 and O2. It is not logically possible for O to be identical to both O1 and O2. And since O has exactly the same relation with both O1 and O2, O cannot be identical to one but not the other.

Indeed, O (as in fission cases) goes out of existence, and is replaced by O1 and O2. Since identity is necessary, as long as it is possible for the result of fertilization to twin (6-12 days after fertilization), what exists as the result of fertilization cannot be an organism; it is just a cell cluster. So, twinning seems to be a real problem for any view (hylomorphic or not) that takes an organism to come into existence at the end of fertilization. In short, although the hylomorphic account of artifacts is excellent, I doubt that it can be extended to organisms that twin.

Although not for novices, this book would work well in a graduate seminar in philosophy. It is dense, but its density is due to the complexity of the issues and the rich detail in which they are discussed. Anyone interested in a sophisticated and lucid investigation of a plethora of issues in contemporary metaphysics would benefit from Making Objects and Events. I recommend it highly.