Making Prehistory: Historical Science and the Scientific Realism Debate

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Derek Turner, Making Prehistory: Historical Science and the Scientific Realism Debate, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 223pp., $91.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521875202.

Reviewed by Stathis Psillos, University of Athens


I am sure most of you have watched one of those marvellous BBC programmes on the life of dinosaurs. It's all happening there before you. The way they walked and ran, their posture, their eating habits, their colour (even of their eyes). It's really impressive. You come to think there is a way to see what happened in the very distant past and that thanks to science (and the BBC, of course) you actually see it. But how is this possible? How can we know (or, at least, have justified beliefs about) what happened in the distant past where no-one was around to keep records and to initiate causal chains of information-transmission to us? Prehistoric events, of course, have left a number of traces; so it must surely be that these are enough (or at least, they are enough under favourable circumstances) to provide premises for reliable inferences that return theories and justified hypotheses about what the past was like. These will be ampliative (hence, defeasible) inferences -- most likely inferences to the best explanation. Isn't science, however, replete with such inferences? There is an epistemic risk involved in getting to know the past, but (you may think) it is different only in degree from the risk involved in getting to know the present (or the future).

Things are not so simple, of course. (Why can't things be simple in philosophy?) Perhaps, those who have thought long and hard about history have known this all along. But for those of us who have worked in the philosophy of science, and especially on scientific realism, it might come a surprise to us as that there might be special epistemological problems with the knowledge of the past and that this implies that to be a scientific realist about the past (or about historical sciences, such as geology and paleobiology, and scientific theories in them) is much harder and more risky than to be a realist about the tiny (or about physical sciences, such as physics and chemistry, and scientific theories in them). A thought many of us intellectually grew up with was that if there is a place where it is safer to be a realist than not, it is in sciences other than physics and chemistry, which, after all, deal with unobserved observables.

I, at least, have been woken from my dogmatic slumbers by Derek Turner's rich and provocative book Making Prehistory: Historical Science and the Scientific Realism Debate. There is much to disagree with in this book, but it is an outstanding book on scientific realism -- one that pushes the debate into hitherto uncharted territories.

Turner takes the past to be epistemologically problematic in two important senses -- both of which involve an epistemic asymmetry between the past and the present. First, there is the asymmetry of manipulability, viz., an inability to intervene (to manipulate) the past. Second, there is the asymmetry of the role of background theories, viz., that background theories about the past imply (as background theories about the present and the tiny do not) that a lot of evidence about the past has been irrevocably destroyed and a lot of possible information channels have been dampened. These asymmetries make rampant local underdetermination of theories about prehistory. In a great deal of cases, we are told, scientists face an issue of choice between rival but empirically equivalent and equally epistemically virtuous theories, with nothing in their hands (no means to generate new phenomena, no sources of additional information) to break the tie. There is a third asymmetry, Turner notes, the asymmetry of analogy, viz., that past posits seem to be analogous to current observable entities. This, it might be thought, eases the problem of knowing the past. But Turner argues that it is precisely this asymmetry that explains why scientists have made a number of mistakes about the past. Hence, relying on analogy is not a reliable way to learn about the past. The general conclusion drawn from the three asymmetries is that there are clear senses in which knowing the past is harder than knowing the tiny and hence that scientific realism about historical sciences is in pretty bad shape (and certainly in worse shape than scientific realism about electrons and genes).

This is about half of the book and one might think that the challenge to realism ends there. But (perhaps somewhat surprisingly) Turner takes the past to be ontologically problematic too. There is a certain sense in which we should take the title of the book entirely literally: scientists do make prehistory. Now, that's not something Turner affirms. But he does not deny it either. He is neutral on this matter. It is a consistent hypothesis that the past is constructed and, for all we know, it might well be constructed. Turner's meta-philosophical stance is anti-metaphysical. Both realism and anti-realism (in all of their guises) impose metaphysical construals on scientific existential claims. They are not content with saying that something exists or is real. Realists add a mind-independence gloss on existence/reality and anti-realists render existence/reality mind-dependent. Turner will have none of this. Does that remind you of something? Right guess! He is a fan of the Natural Historical Attitude, which is (a) an agnostic attitude towards metaphysical questions and (b) a 'gnostic' stance towards historical knowledge -- we do have some knowledge of the past, though its extent should not be exaggerated, as the very idea of an epistemic access to the past is inexorably subject to the aforementioned asymmetries.

This outlines the broader picture. In what follows I will offer a brief critical commentary on the chapters, and I will raise some worries about some of the central planks of Turner's project.

Chapter 1 explores the asymmetries of knowledge and introduces an epistemic distinction between the past and the microphysical (the tiny). Turner claims that we can know more about the tiny than the past. He understands scientific realism as primarily an epistemic position, asserting the knowability of the unobservable, and claims that it is safer to be a scientific realist about the tiny unobservable. When it comes to the past, the defensible position is what he calls "historical hypo-realism". But are past things (e.g., dinosaurs) unobservable? Received wisdom has it that they are not -- at least in the sense that they could be observed by suitably placed observers. Turner disputes received wisdom and claims that dinosaurs and their ilk are unobservable. Part of chapter 1 and most of chapter 3 are about this issue. On top of this, Turner argues that there are two distinct types of unobservable -- the tiny and the past -- and that this typical distinction bears an epistemic weight. Unobservables of type P(ast) are more difficult to be known than of type T(iny).

I have qualms with this, of course. Dinosaurs are unlike electrons in terms of unobservability. The sense in which dinosaurs cannot be seen by the naked (human) eye is different from the sense in which electrons cannot -- different sorts of modalities are involved here. Some laws of nature would have to be violated for either of them to be seen, but (interestingly) seeing dinosaurs (but not electrons) would not require a significant violation of the fundamental laws of nature. The possible world in which dinosaurs are observed is closer to the actual world than the possible world in which electrons are observed. Observability is a matter of degree, but if we care to make a partition among the actually observed, the observable and the unobservable, dinosaurs are closer to the middle than electrons. In any case, are there epistemically distinct types of unobservables? This cannot be an intrinsic difference of course; it will have to do with a principled difference about how an entity can be known by humans. Hence, it will have to do with the methods used to know that something is the case.

The bulk of chapter 2 and most of chapter 3 are about the methodological asymmetry between knowing the past and knowing the tiny. There is an attractive point by Carol Cleland that capitalises on the Lewisian thesis of the asymmetry of overdetermination (the present overdetermines the past but it underdetermines the future) in order to argue that there is, after all, an epistemic symmetry between knowing the past and knowing the present (and the future), and hence an epistemic symmetry between the methods of historical sciences and the method of physical (experimental, as she would put it) sciences. The idea is that historical scientists explore the present-to-past overdetermination to look for a tie-breaker between rival past hypotheses (a trace entailed by one but not by the other), whereas experimental scientists exploit the present-to-future underdetermination to devise experiments and establish predictions that can tell competing hypotheses apart. On Cleland's view, there is no principled difference between the two methods and both historical sciences and experimental sciences have an equal claim to justified belief and knowledge. Turner disagrees with all this. What he offers as a reply, however, is not entirely convincing. He thinks (rightly) that there is widespread local undetermination of past hypotheses. But he goes on to say that this kind of underdetermination is "less common in experimental science" (57). Why? Because in historical sciences, unlike in experimental science, scientists cannot manufacture a crucial experiment. Asymmetry number 2 implies that we know that we have irrevocably lost crucial information about the past. Fine, I can see there is a difference. But, is it not overstated? First, technological advancements (e.g., computer simulation) can provide plausible missing information about past processes. Second, the manipulation of the tiny can help break underdetermination ties only if we are allowed to bring into the picture the disparate theoretical virtues of competing theories. But we can do exactly that for competing hypotheses about the past.

Turner, in chapter 3, has interesting responses to this and other objections made to his argument so far. For instance, he draws a distinction between a unifier (an entity that plays a unifying role) and a producer (an entity that can be manipulated to produce new phenomena), and argues that past (un)observables (like dinosaurs) can at best be unifiers whereas tiny unobservables can be producers too. On the basis of this he argues that abductive arguments for past posits will be weaker than abductive arguments for tiny posits. There is a problem with this, however. What about the past and the tiny, e.g., a short-lived lepton? It is posited to explain (by unification, let us say) something that has already happened and though it is manipulable (in principle, at least) it was not manipulated in any way. Doesn't the same hold for a token of the type T-Rex? Qua a type of entity a lepton is both a unifier and a producer, though some tokens of it are posited as unifiers and others as producers (or both). I think the same goes for dinosaur (qua type): it is both unifier and producer, though (it seems that) all tokens of it are posited as unifiers and none as (actual) producers -- though they did produce and they are subject to hypothetical manipulation. (There are some deep issues here that are being ducked in this short review -- for instance, the existence and the role of laws in physics and in paleobiology which are supposed to 'link' the present with the past and the future -- but Turner does not seem to worry much about this issue.)

Chapter 4 discusses the pessimistic induction, noting that the argument has equal force against historical realism and experimental realism. One here would have expected some engagement with the argument itself -- after all, it is an argument about the past -- but there is virtually none. Chapter 5, on the other hand, is a detailed study of the role of novel predictions in the scientific realism debate. Here, there is an obvious candidate for an epistemic asymmetry between historical sciences and experimental ones -- one that puts the historical sciences at a relative epistemic disadvantage vis-à-vis the experimental sciences: there are no novel predictions in the historical sciences. If novelty is understood as use-novelty and not as temporal-novelty, it is not so obvious that the historical sciences do not yield novel predictions. But this was a very neglected area and it is to Turner's great credit that he discusses this issue in great detail, offering some fascinating examples of novel predictions in archaeology, paleobiology etc. Novel predictions are not necessarily testable. For Turner this implies that historical sciences are not worse than fundamental physics in this respect. I simply have no views on this matter.

There is a lot of exciting material in chapter 6, where the idea of the past being socially constructed is being discussed. Turner presents a number of distinct motivations for adopting forms of 'constructivism' -- from Berkeley's, to Kant's, to Kuhn's, to Dummett's, to Latour's. Not all of them are, of course, constructivists and to the extent they can be lumped together as constructivists (anti-realists) their differences might be more significant than their similarities. Turner's discussion is nuanced (though, I felt that more care would have been needed in the exegesis of Dummett and modern verificationism). But the bottom-line of chapter 6 is that one may well remain agnostic on the issue of whether the past is real or constructed. This might be surprising for a reason that Turner does not seem to note. I take it that a sort of realism about the past is required in the discussion, in the previous chapters, of local underdetermination, the information-destroying processes, etc. that are supposed to place the historical sciences in an epistemically disadvantageous position. What sort? That there are historical matters of fact that would make one of the two (or many) competing theories true, but that somehow these facts cannot be accessed. If these facts are not independent in some relatively robust sense (an evidence-transcendent sense, at least), if they are 'socially constructed' as we go along, there is no reason to think that there will be (worse: there must be) significant gaps in the past. If facts about the past change over time, or if facts about the past are brought in and out of existence by scientists, it is not obvious to me why the past resists its incorporation into theories.

There is something quite puzzling in Turner's treatment of the issue of mind-independence. Here is (roughly) how he sets things up. Realists say: there are Xs (or X occurred) and they exist independently of the mental (or X occurred independently of the mental). Constructivists say: there are Xs (or X occurred) and they exist in a mind-dependent way (or X occurred mind-dependently). Given this set-up, he complains that the bits that occur after the 'and' are metaphysical add-ons to perfectly sensible scientific claims; they are not empirical hypotheses; they are not confirmable by the evidence etc. etc. But these are not add-ons! Better put: they do not have to be construed as add-ons to be perfectly legitimate empirical claims. Turner, to his credit, does note that this would be a natural reply (148-9), viz., that what is taken to be an add-on is really a way to unpack existential claims (and there may well be different ways to unpack such claims). But what he says in reply (149) seems to me to miss the point.

In any case, Turner's considered claim is that we are faced with a more general case of local underdetermination: scientific theories underdetermine the choice between realism (mind-independence) and social constructivism (mind-dependence). On top of this, we are told, there is reason to think that "information about whether something happened mind-dependently or mind-independently will never get preserved in the historical record" (156). I take it that Turner has some fun here. Too bad that universals, numbers, events and all the rest of the ontic categories do not leave any traces. If Turner is right, all metaphysics is killed off! Perhaps, Turner would be better off if he looked into the logical empiricist tradition of distinguishing between empirical realism and metaphysical realism. One may well be able to leave metaphysics behind without simply being neutral on the realism-constructivism issue.

The Natural Historical Attitude that is presented in chapter 7 is partly an antidote to constructive empiricism. Turner argues (following Kitcher) that constructive empiricism implies scepticism about the past. This, however, depends on whether we think that past posits are observable or not. And we have discussed that already. It is welcoming news that NHA (like its parent NOA) is not a sceptical stance. The key idea behind this anti-sceptical stance is what Turner calls 'the Principle of Parity' (what I have called the no-double-standards principle), viz., the very same methods of confirmation apply to claims that purport to refer to both observable and unobservable entities, and hence claims about unobservables can be as well supported by the relevant evidence as claims about observables. Finally, chapter 8 offers a detailed and insightful examination of the role of consilience in theory choice.

Anyone interested in the scientific realism debate will greatly appreciate this book.