Making Sense of Heidegger: A Paradigm Shift

Placeholder book cover

Thomas Sheehan, Making Sense of Heidegger: A Paradigm Shift, Rowman and Littlefield, 2015, 349pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781783481194.

Reviewed by Laurence Hemming, Lancaster University


Thomas Sheehan is one of the pre-eminent commentators on Heidegger in the English-speaking world: this is his fourth major work on Heidegger and sits among numerous articles. In contrast to not a few contemporary commentators on Heidegger, Sheehan draws widely and deeply on material right across the now vast Gesamtausgabe or 'collected works' of Heidegger (in this review I indicate the volumes of these with the now conventional abbreviation GA, with the relevant volume and page number). This book is the first in an important new series sponsored by the mainly North American 'Heidegger Circle'. Not the least of the book's virtues is that it is appears in attractive and very affordable paperback format, with impeccable editing, which bodes well both for a new publisher (albeit a division of a much older one) and a new series. Sheehan's is already an important, if controversial, book and is being widely cited -- two recent PhD theses I have been asked to review make extensive appeal to it. If Sheehan's stature as a commentator on Heidegger were not already enough to recommend it, the book is written in a lucid and approachable style (if not without occasional lapses into the jargon of the seminar-room), and Sheehan continually alerts readers to the complexity and difficulties in understanding terms central to Heidegger's work, like Dasein and Ereignis.

The book clears up important confusions for some readers of Heidegger. It contains one of the most lucid accounts of Heidegger's use of the Greek term ecstasis, showing how understanding emerges not from our projecting-forth, but our having been thrown into that 'wherein', where we are already standing out ahead of ourselves and so receiving back what being in the world means. Furthermore, the book is an important reminder of what the earlier Heidegger discovered in Aristotle -- to which the whole of the first part is devoted. Repeatedly Sheehan draws (in extensive and careful footnotes) on his wide knowledge of the Collected Works to make or illustrate important connections in Heidegger's thinking across his whole corpus.

Where Sheehan does the greatest service is in very firmly reminding us that the whole of Heidegger's oeuvre needs to be understood in relation to the only book he ever actually wrote, Sein und Zeit (Being and Time, GA2), which itself remained unfinished. There were other texts, but they were either short essays, or publications of lectures, or, like the so-called Kant-Book (GA3) and the Nietzsche volumes (GA6.1 and 6.2), re-workings of Heidegger's student lectures. Even the Contributions to Philosophy (GA65) began life as a notebook. Moreover Heidegger himself acknowledged this, remarking in the early 1930s that he is in danger of being a man of one book, a book he had no choice to write, and which he would always be writing (see GA94: p. 22). Sheehan is very occupied with reconstructing the missing third part of the first division, perhaps not always entirely convincingly. Heidegger himself returned to how Being and Time was to be interpreted, not once, but over and over right until the end, both in later published work and in the vast quantity of private notebooks that have now begun to make their appearance in the Collected Works.

One of the surprises of Sheehan's book is the frequency with which he rebukes his subject: Heidegger stands in need of clarification because he is "notoriously sloppy" (p. xiv), his "confusion" (p. 243 et passim) can be "hair-pulling" in its "carelessness" (p. xv). This is how I was taught philosophy at Oxford: great thinkers are at times untidy and make mistakes, which we can easily be their equals in sorting out on their behalf. Many Heidegger scholars will disagree.  My own experience of reading Heidegger is that he is notoriously exact. Sheehan has a tendency to want lexical precision (and has a tendency to identify a passage that he then argues is paradigmatic for that precision, any other of Heidegger's uses notwithstanding), whereas Heidegger constantly exploits the ambiguity and polyvalences of the terms he both employs and analyses in order to show the complexities at hand, and above all, to make us think. Moreover, with Heidegger the context and audience is everything: what is said in an edited book takes quite a different form in a private notebook or again in a student lecture, even though material from all three genres is now available. Sheehan does not always encourage us to make allowances for this, nor does he help us to distinguish between the different registers in which Heidegger writes. In consequence, he can at times simply pluck lines out of their original contexts, and setting them side by side, force them to comment on and explain each other, when in fact they shouldn't and can't.

The subtitle of Sheehan's book is A Paradigm Shift. What is paradigmatic about this book, and why is there need for a shift at the present time? Here we need to look more closely both within the book and beyond it to understand what Sheehan is about. The book makes, for many Heidegger scholars (including many in the Heidegger Circle), two controversial claims, laid out schematically early on (p. xii). The first is that "both 'beingness' (Seiendheit) in traditional metaphysics and 'being' (Sein) in [Heidegger's] own work" are "formally the same" and "co-equal expressions", and both of them "bespeak the Anwesen of things -- that is their meaningful presence within the worlds of human interests and concerns". Sheehan later truncates this to the claim that being (or beingness) is meaningful presence. The second claim follows from the first, that "Heidegger's project finally makes sense only when we realize that he was after the source of such meaningful presence" (Sheehan's italics) and "that this source turns out to be what he called 'the appropriated clearing' (die ereignete Lichtnug), which is the same as thrown open/appropriated human ex-istence (das geworfene/ereignete Da-sein)" (p. xii). Sheehan seeks to show "as thoroughly as I can, how my reading is grounded in Heidegger's own texts and not in the work, as excellent as it might be, of others" (p. xiii). The paradigm shift, he argues "is necessary in order to understand [Heidegger's] whole corpus, to take on board its positive contributions to philosophy, and to throw overboard what may be of no help" (p. xix). Sheehan generously adds that he welcomes "any and all criticisms of this effort" (p. xix).

The apparatus for the first of Sheehan's claims -- that being is meaningful presence -- he presented rather more plausibly in a 2014 article "What After All, Was Heidegger About?" (Continental Philosophy Review, vol. 47, pp. 249-274), and it is disappointing that he does not repeat very much of that material here. Sheehan's defence of these two claims and the inferences he makes from them is not without a certain mischief. His claim that Being and Time "stands in the centuries-long tradition of the transcendental turn to the subject" is akin to arguing that Wellington was one of Napoleon's collaborators at Waterloo.  It is not entirely false, but it masks both the nature of the engagement and the outcome: in this case that the real genealogy of Being and Time is that it functions as a modern-day version of Aristotle's De Anima, and that Heidegger from beginning to end was an implacable and vocal opponent of every form of subjectivity, subjectivism, and subjecticity (all Heidegger's words), and every attempt to privilege the "subject" as the "I-think me thinking" from Descartes and Kant onwards, which characterised the whole philosophical tradition of modernity. Centrally, the most absolute thinker of this subjectivity is Hegel, who transformed Kant's 'supersensible' philosophy into a politics that took its most extreme form in Marx, but also in democratic Liberalism, from which we are yet to escape. One of the pitfalls that dogs too much Heidegger scholarship is the repeated insistence by commentators that the word Dasein is in some way a masked name for the rehabilitated subject. Sheehan neglects to tell us that the very term 'ontotheology' (which he discusses extensively) began life as a critique of Hegel's subjectivity, in the form of "onto-theo-ego-logy" (GA32, pp. 193). Within this term, therefore, is inscribed the political connection between immediate and absolute subjectivity, a connection that is carried over into both Marx's and Nietzsche's thought in a variety of ways.

In this vein, what is odd about Sheehan's account is not what it describes, but what it leaves out. His claim that Being and Beingness are co-equal, and that Heidegger also meant the same with them is unsustainable. Not once but often Heidegger attacks beingness as the metaphysical name for presence -- most importantly in the works of Aristotle (see esp. GA6.1, p. 488: "the beingness of beings, this says constant presence"). In his Nietzsche lectures he argues (GA6.1, p. 540 ff) that because Aristotle privileges being as beingness he is unable to think the ambiguity implicit to man in being the placeholder of permanence and impermanence, presence and absence, at one and the same time. Only through this ambiguity is man capable of dissolving his relation to beings as such through his belonging to his own 'unessence' (Unwesen) (GA6.1, p. 543). It is this belonging to his unessence that explains Heidegger's central description of the forgetfulness of being in a way that Sheehan's own and very truncated account ignores -- that man forgets being and that being is itself a forgetting, a letting pass-away. Sheehan is disturbed by what he sees as a kind of anthropomorphism or agency of being in some of Heidegger's language, but all that Heidegger's language really means is that an essential feature of (our) being is this letting-pass-away (Greek phthora). Aristotle's turning away from the unessence of man, and his assertion of the principle of non-contradiction as a privileging of that which is 'presently' or constantly present, disbars a fundamental understanding of how contradictories can be held together in the same time and place. This inability to understand how contraries belong together is the very inception of the 'logic' of metaphysics (in Aristotle), a logic that underpins the syllogism, and from which Nietzsche is not able to break free.

Thus Sheehan also focuses only on the constantly present, that is, on presence, or in his terms, das Anwesen. But by Anwesen Heidegger means not the constantly present, but things at once present and absent, in their becoming or presencing (see GA7 esp. pp. 248 and ff.) At times Heidegger's use of the term Anwesen is shorthand for the proper belonging-together of two terms that metaphysics has torn asunder: presence (die Anwesenheit) and presencing (das Anwesen). For Heidegger, metaphysics triumphed historically because presence (beständige Anwesenheit) is thought as the prior and more fundamental of the two, and banishes presencing into hiddenness.

Nowhere is the belonging together of sheer presence and temporal presencing and passing away more clearly explained than in Heidegger's reading of the Anaximander fragment (see GA5, pp. 321-373), but although Sheehan makes one reference to the volume where this reading of Anaximander is most developed (GA78), he overlooks the distinction. Precisely because Sheehan underplays the belonging together of presencing/presence, he is hindered in explaining the place of das Nichts, 'the nothing', either in Being and Time or more widely in Heidegger's thought. Yet even in Being and Time, the nothing is an essential aspect of the question of being and of being itself, and as such, an essential reason why being as such cannot be reduced to meaning or even meaningfulness.

The question of Heidegger's positive contribution to philosophy is, of course, firmly back in the spotlight. Of the volumes of notebooks I have already mentioned (which amount to thousands of pages and at least fifteen volumes), four books have achieved pre-eminence at the very time Sheehan's volume has appeared: the so-called 'Black Notebooks' (GA94-97, with one more yet to appear). They confirm and add to remarks of Heidegger's that Sheehan had already collated and presented in an essay for the New York Review of Books (January 14, 1993: pp. 30-35), which exhibit not only Heidegger's commitment to Hitlerism and Nazism, but his appalling and reprehensible use, both personally and philosophically, of the language and attitude of anti-Semitism, up to at least the year 1946. Sheehan defines this as "Heidegger's profound social and cultural conservatism and cultural anti-modernism", and he raises the question of whether they "haemorrhage into his 'philosophical' analysis of the contemporary world". He adds, "Liberalism and democracy, however they might be defined -- let alone 'the Jews' -- were not Heidegger's favourite friends" (p. 260, and see esp. note 40).

For Sheehan, therefore, the urgency of establishing the 'New Paradigm' will be determinative for whether Heidegger can or should continue to be read at all. In this, Sheehan presents himself as something of a saviour -- as one who will show us how we can jettison the conservative, Nazi, anti-Semitic Heidegger and continue reading him with our heads held high. Anyone who has experienced a deal of homophobia in their lives will recognise in this the gesture of the self-assuredly 'straight' hero who offers the persecuted lesbian or gay man protection against bullies. There have been plenty of bullies -- Karl Löwith, Victor Farías, Richard Wolin, Emmanuel Faye to name but a few, some (like Löwith, who suffered exile under the Nazis) not without justice in their grievances. Sheehan has done sterling battle with Faye only recently, and exposed the ridiculousness of many of his claims (despite an often perspicacious underlying scholarship).

The problem is that being the hero comes at a price, and also threatens his reputation: his friendship and the guarantee he offers must be repaid by the silence or suppression of whatever might embarrass him or expose him to guilt by association. This surely explains Sheehan's irascible tone in presenting his reading of Heidegger. While no serious person any more claims that being homosexual is culpable, being a racist most assuredly is, and Heidegger scholars must, and must continue to say so, and loudly. Nevertheless Sheehan falls into the trap of disciplining Heidegger before he may be allowed to sit at the common table. Sheehan laments that in the whole of the Heidegger corpus "there is not a single mention of Kapitalismus" (p. 288; but in fact, see GA90, p. 118, or Heidegger's references to Lenin, which are surprisingly frequent), seemingly oblivious to the fact that his own insightful translation of Heidegger's later term das Gestell as "exploitable-for-use" places that discourse firmly into the same province as anything capitalism was ever intended to name. That everything extant and present is so only as exploitable should have alerted him to how close to Marx Heidegger can come at times: both were revolutionary thinkers.

Like many gallants, it is Sheehan and not Heidegger who is the true conservative in wanting to wrestle Heidegger back into respectability. Sheehan fails to see in the transition from Being and Time to his later work Heidegger's attempt, however ill-preparedly, to face up to the demands of "being-as-a-whole", that is, to the historical and political times through which he lived, because, exactly as so many people do now, he experienced at first hand through war, hyper-inflation and social unrest that "the entire globe is shifting out of joint" (p. 259, citing Heidegger). It is Heidegger's extraordinary power to set the present times in relation to the whole of history that gives us thoughtful pause even when we are confronted with Heidegger's claims about the inner greatness of the movement that gave us National Socialism: it was after all the revolutionary movement itself, and its trajectory, its whither and whereunto, that Heidegger was trying to understand. At a time when no serious thinker could possibly want to resurrect the claims of fascism in any of its forms, but when the claims of Marxism look hardly less discredited, the claims of Liberalism (which Heidegger discussed in several places, especially in relation to Hegel and Schelling -- see GA86 and GA42) and an adequate language either to critique or defend them are also all too frequently lacking. It is that, for which many even now are still groping toward, that Heidegger was also seeking. We do not need to repeat Heidegger's mistakes (and must not flinch from naming them) in order to try to understand what he was striving toward. Sheehan's book is a significant achievement, and it will assist many, especially relatively new, readers of Heidegger, but I am not so sure that it is the new paradigm the times themselves demand.