Making Space for Justice: Social Movements, Collective Imagination, and Political Hope

Making Space For Justice

Michele Moody-Adams, Making Space for Justice: Social Movements, Collective Imagination, and Political Hope, Columbia University Press, 2022, 345pp., $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231201377.

Reviewed by Chris Lebron, John Hopkins University


A recent observer of American politics would be forgiven for thinking we were in the formative stages of developing a decent society. The last two decades have seen no less than three major social movements. Occupy Wall Street cast the One Percent as current-day robber barons responsible for the absurd lopsidedness of wealth distribution in a supposedly fair democracy; #MeToo brought the hidden-in-plain-sight secret of women’s sexual abuse and exploitation at the hands of powerful men to the fore of public discourse; and #BlackLivesMatter found itself in the awkward position of, in the 21st century—sixty years after the ‘success’ of the Civil Rights Movement—making the case that black people should not be killed by the police, or anyone for that matter, just for being black in public. Among the other kinds of problems these issues represent, they represent moral problems. So, a recent observer would also be forgiven for asking why professional moral and political philosophers haven’t been more helpful. If ever we needed ethical guidance from on high, surely now is the time. Yet, Michele Moody-Adams’s Making Space For Justice, powerfully and unflinchingly argues that philosophers’ reflections “have no special authority in the pursuit of social justice” (2). Rather, movements themselves provide the stuff of ethical guidance, particularly where it concerns clearing socio-political ground for justice.

Moody-Adams’s argument works like this. Progressive social movements practice ‘engaged social inquiry,’ and here, ‘engaged’ is doing special work because it indicates that the project of morally framing societal wrongs is directly tethered to two features. First, to the actual experiences of those subject to societal wrongs. Second, to both the actual and potential political possibilities and impossibilities in redressing those wrongs. This would be active reflective equilibrium simpliciter if it wasn’t for one feature crucial to the task of social movements—moving beyond mere practical reasoning and engaging imagination to bring before the civic mind a vision of a society that can only be achieved if we release ourselves from our worst habits. The resulting process is what Moody-Adams usefully labels ‘cognitive praxis.’

Imagination is essential to Moody-Adams’s account because progressive social movements are after something fundamental, yet elusive and difficult—compelling humane regard towards members of marginalized groups. Justice’s formal requirements in a modern democracy are important, yet pedestrian: achieving equality of rights, liberties, and protection under the law. No doubt, a society cannot be reasonably described as well-ordered without these principles providing at least a common goal. But if we consider the term ‘marginalized’ we easily see a problem. A society’s dominant and privileged members can have two thoughts at the same time: we are a society of equals and those people over there do not qualify for the benefits of our society because they are not our equals. This is how we can have black people being shot dead with near impunity on the streets of the world’s most advanced democracy. Here, equal rights won’t do the trick if black people, for example, are not seen in the first instance as legitimate possessors of those rights, and the only way to get there is by reconfiguring the value of black Americans (or women or the poor or queer Americans). Moody-Adams identifies humane regard as the substantive aim of progressive social movements.

But that ideal is not without its potential complications. Indeed, it might entail a clash between two subsidiary ideas. On the one hand, humane regard requires compassionate concern—a mode of ethical attentiveness which emphasizes our horizontal relations, our civic connectedness; for instance, my cloistered middle-class suburb here might be contributing to that under-funded public school district over there. On the other, it also requires taking seriously the moral separateness of persons. Here, Moody-Adams endorses standard modern liberal preoccupations in wanting to hold firm the metaphysical premise of individuality made manifest in a publicly accountable democracy. The tension, then, is between seeing how you and I share a life in common and yet are independent sources of moral claims. This is where imagination becomes essential to Moody-Adams’s account.

Imagination is an idea that has become increasingly leaned-upon by theorists to help resolve the thorniest problem in social theory—rational choice cannot overcome bias, and is, indeed, often its victim. Unless we are to throw in the towel and accept that our sociological quagmires are here to stay, what tools are at our disposal to circumvent the perversities of bias? Imagination is here to drain that swamp. Moody-Adams identifies four kinds of imagination that progressive social movements commonly seek to activate among the public: sympathetic, aesthetic, epistemic, and narrative. These four kinds of imagination, which refer to exactly what one would expect, perform the book title’s task: they make space for justice. They permit those for whom bias disrupts rationality the room to cognitively maneuver, as it were. These aspects of imagination, on Moody-Adams’s account, make space for justice in three ways.

[They] convince people that a given set of circumstances actually constitute injustice and that the harms experienced by those subject to it ought to be addressed. . . .people must be persuaded that there is a reasonable remedy for that injustice and that is sensible to hope for its realization. . . .they  must be convinced that it is humanly and politically possible to realize the objects of that hope in practice. (5)

Thus, what imaginative efforts made by progressive social movements seek to accomplish is disrupting the relationship between social perception and social bias. It isn’t the case, for example, that black people don’t want to work; rather, it’s that whites’ hoarding of economic opportunities leaves everyone worse off and this need not be a necessary by-product of capitalism—we can really engineer institutions to make us all better off. To the extent that imagination can accomplish such feats, the irrationality of bias can be short-circuited, and cognitive praxis wins the day be helping our society adhere to the precepts of humane regard for the marginalized. Space has been made for justice.

Making Space For Justice is both sensitive and erudite, an uncommon combination in a work of philosophy. Moody-Adams’s sensitivity is fueled by a sense of humility that prompts her to probe for the best ideas in the lives, actions, and words of activists who have and are facing down injustice on the ground. Moody-Adams deploys examples ranging from the historically usual to the more recently emerging. The doctrine of non-violence was powerfully put to work by Mahatma Gandhi and Martin Luther King Jr. as imaginative leaps because the refusal to meet force with force introduced a kind of dissonance in white observers—‘bestial’ blacks became human because it was the white violent racists who now looked inhuman as they kicked, punched, clubbed, and hosed people simply asking for recognition. Thus, “the moral insights generated by social movements are sometimes most valuable for their capacity to show where ordinary moral consciousness falls short” (81). More recent examples include global campaigns to topple monuments celebrating slaveholders and European conquerors. Such attempts present “a powerful statement of a familiar idea: the notion that we cannot remake the world in the pursuit of human freedom and human dignity unless we can first reimagine it” (118–9). Additionally, Moody-Adams is uncommonly wide-ranging in the scholastic literature she references—from philosophy to social psychology to anthropology—as well as sumptuously generous because every author is treated as a potential partner in paving a path towards a solution rather than an intellectual rival to be removed on the path to analytic glory.

Moody-Adams’s book, then, represents a sort of triumph of both mind and intellectual spirit. I cannot recommend strongly enough that educators expose their undergraduates to the rich terrain she maps for readers. Moody-Adams’s prose is effective and often affecting, direct and free from indulgent jargon. It is clear the primary goal is to provide a work that is first and foremost accessible and illuminating.

Yet, that is not to say one might not have some critical concerns. I will highlight three here that are offered precisely because I respect the book greatly and share the worries that motivated Moody-Adams to write in the first place (or so I presume).

First, Moody-Adams, is an optimist. This is not at all the same as being naïve—she is not that by any stretch. But it is hard to escape the sense that beneath her concerns is a foundation built on a very modern liberal faith best given voice by King’s own words, that the arc of the moral universe bends towards justice. Clearly, Moody-Adams believes we all need to get out and help pull that arc towards us a little more forcefully because history shows it won’t just come quietly in for a landing. Yet, one senses the belief that the arc seems inclined to cooperate with our needs. I have serious doubts about this, doubts that have only intensified since American voters put a white supremacist in the White House and have since been split in a manner too-close-for-comfort in revisiting that presidency. The book was written, or at least edited, recently enough to reference the January 6 insurrection but ultimately Moody-Adams does not take these or other events as possibly legitimate reasons to radically rethink what it is that black and brown and other marginalized groups might now start seriously considering. In the case of racial justice, maybe it just is time to leave white Americans to their business and revisit the notion of black empowerment for black people, period. I can’t say that this ought to be the strategy, but I am saying that it’s a point of some worry that Moody-Adams seems to take it as given that modern liberal ideals are still worth their weight in gold. This is not at all obviously true. Similarly, the failure of Bernie Sanders or Elizabeth Warren to gain traction as candidates should make us worry that Americans simply do not care enough about the poor to motivate anything like an egalitarian ethos. At what point do we just accept that maybe something is really broken with us? This is a serious question not taken seriously by Moody-Adams.

Second, Moody-Adams proceeds with a familiar, and, I think, increasingly common wariness of how useful professional philosophy is or can be for confronting political problems. A main throughline of the book is that philosophers can learn from social movements rather than the other way round. I see nothing wrong with the claim that philosophers can learn from what is happening in the real world. I’m more circumspect, though, of the claim that we have, as she says, no special authority. I take it that authority is not the same as superiority. That being the case, philosophers absolutely do or—at risk of sounding flippant, which is not my intent—Moody-Adams would not have written a book she surely hopes many people read and act upon in some way. Our authority stems from the fact of a division of labor. We have spent our time doing not much else save thinking very closely about the trickiest of moral problems. Surely this qualifies us for something more than grading final papers? Moreover, this overlooks the fact that the most effective of social movement leaders and public figures were, if not formally trained, then certainly practically effective philosophers, with Martin Luther King, Jr. being the most obvious example. Maybe it is similarly worth noting the absence of such intellectually inclined figures in many of our current social movements and their inability to really effect more radical change than has been achieved. The problem here, then, is not that one is or isn’t a professional philosopher but whether one is capaciously so, whether one is a professional philosopher whose happiest life is in defining terms rather than seeing what those terms can actually do for people. What makes her position more ironic is that Moody-Adams relies equally, if not more so, on the academic literature in making her points rather than the writings or interviews of movement leaders.

Lastly, and relatedly, while the humility Moody-Adams practices is healthy and insightful in many regards, a reader might wish she were a bit more assertive on the page. In her erudition and generosity, Moody-Adams spends a great deal of time mapping out points in the various literatures and does not hesitate to invite onto the page a wide cast of academic characters. This, in my view, is often done to the detriment of her own voice for readers might yearn precisely for the authority of Moody-Adams’s voice to indicate a way forward. Though this might violate her preferred ethic of ceding authority, it is in fact consistent with much of what is already on the page because ultimately, the book is a product of Moody-Adams’s powerful analytic mind synthesizing observations and arguments to produce a framework that gives unified sense to otherwise disparate social movement issues.

My criticisms, if they are correct, should in no way dampen one’s desire to engage the book. One can learn a great deal even from that which is improvable. That is, after all, the entire point of Making Space For Justice.