Making the Social World: The Structure of Human Civilization

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John R. Searle, Making the Social World: The Structure of Human Civilization, Oxford University Press, 2010, 208pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195396171.

Reviewed by Savas L. Tsohatzidis, Aristotle University of Thessaloniki


This book will be useful to readers familiar with Searle's work in the philosophy of language and the philosophy of mind, but unacquainted with, and curious to learn about, the 'philosophy of society' that he has been busy building since the mid-nineties. Such readers are offered a lengthy exposition (Chapters 1, 3, 5) of an updated version of the account of institutional facts that was the main theme of Searle's The Construction of Social Reality (1995), as well as shorter discussions (mostly drawing on material already presented in two subsequent books, 2001 and 2007) of what Searle perceives as the implications of his account of institutions on issues pertaining to rational action, free will, political power, and human rights (Chapters 6, 7, 8). The book will also be useful to readers who have developed an interest in Searle's account of institutional reality while lacking sufficient exposure to his philosophies of mind and language, since it includes brief overviews (Chapters 2, 4) of his extensive work in these fields, which he presents as providing the foundations of his account of society. Readers already familiar with Searle's major works on mind, language, and society will probably be mainly interested in considering whether the account of institutional facts he currently adopts differs significantly from the one he had originally proposed, and, if so, whether it places him in a better position than before to attain his stated goals.

Common to Searle's old and new accounts is a conception of institutional facts according to which such a fact (a) cannot exist unless a community collectively accepts it as existing; (b) requires the assignment to an entity of a "status function" (that is, of a function that an entity can only have by virtue of collective recognition, and not merely by virtue of whatever properties it might have prior to such recognition); and (c) characteristically generates, once in existence, "deontic powers" (in particular, rights and obligations) within the community whose behaviour brings it to existence.

One difference between Searle's old and new accounts is that the generation of "deontic powers" is now taken to be a universal consequence, and not merely, as was previously the case, a nearly universal consequence, of an institutional fact's creation (24). But the main difference between the old and new accounts has to do with the way in which Searle proposes to combine theses (a) and (b) above in providing an explanation of an institutional fact's creation. On the old account, the creation of institutional facts was invariably supposed to be the immediate result of the collective acceptance, within a community, of linguistically expressible "constitutive rules" that specify conditions under which status functions of various sorts are assignable to entities of various sorts. On the new account, the collective acceptance of such constitutive rules remains one but is not the only source from which institutional reality is supposed to spring; the other supposed source is the collective acceptance of speech acts of declaration, whereby entities come to possess status functions just by being represented as having those functions, even in the absence of antecedently available constitutive rules regulating those functions' assignment.

Searle, however, believes that there must be a single fundamental principle underlying the creation of all institutional facts, and so does not rest content with these two seemingly disparate sources. In an attempt to theoretically unify them, he recalls his assumption that, in order to be institutionally effective, constitutive rules have to be linguistically expressible, and reinterprets linguistically expressed constitutive rules that are institutionally effective as themselves speech acts of declaration of a special kind, namely as "standing declarations" (13, 96-7). He therefore concludes that all of institutional reality derives from the collective acceptance of declarational speech acts (whether "standing" or not "standing") that concern the assignment of status functions to entities (and he accordingly calls the acts in question "status function declarations"). Searle clearly regards his proposal to provide a unified account of institutions by tracing their origins to declarational speech acts as the book's most significant contribution: "The main theoretical innovation of this book and one, though not the only, reason for my writing it is that I want to introduce a very strong theoretical claim. All institutional facts, and therefore all status functions, are created by speech acts of a type that in 1975 I baptized as "Declarations." " (11). This claim -- and, given the claim's centrality, the book as a whole -- appears to me problematic in at least three respects.

The first problem stems from the fact that the theoretical unification the claim strives to achieve is more apparent than real, even assuming that the notion of a declaration (that is, of a speech act that makes something the case just by representing it as being the case) is sufficiently well developed to serve Searle's purposes.[1] The crucial thing to notice in this connection is that, given Searle's own assumption that every institutional fact requires the assignment of a status function to an entity, so-called "standing" status function declarations, unlike status function declarations of the ordinary variety (which I shall henceforth call "grounded" status function declarations) do not create institutional facts but only conditions for the creation of institutional facts. They do not, in other words, make it the case, just by representing it as being the case, that a particular entity has a particular status function. They only make it the case, just by representing it as being the case, that, if any entity satisfies such and such conditions, then that entity will have such and such a status function.

For example, a community might have collectively accepted a constitutive rule ("standing declaration") specifying under what conditions two individuals belonging to it and married to each other may divorce. But if no married individuals belonging to that community ever seek or obtain the status function of being divorced, no institutional facts of divorce will ever exist in that community (and, significantly for Searle, no divorce-dependent rights and obligations will ever be held by any member of that community), even though a well defined procedure for creating such facts (and such rights and obligations) will be in existence. Similarly, a community might have collectively accepted a constitutive rule ("standing declaration") specifying under what conditions a judge may confer on someone the status function of a person sentenced to death. But as long as no judge actually sentences a person to death by issuing the relevant "grounded" declaration, no institutional fact of a person's being sentenced to death will exist in that community (and no member of that community will have such a person's rights and obligations), even though a procedure for creating such facts (and such rights and obligations) will be in place.

Now, if "standing" status function declarations (that is, constitutive rules) do not literally create institutional facts, but, at most, conditions for creating institutional facts, the only instrument left to Searle for accounting, as he intends to do, for the creation of every institutional fact is what I have called "grounded" status function declarations. And the problem is that, although many institutional facts can indeed be created by such declarations, many others cannot. A judge can sentence someone to death just by saying, "You are sentenced to death," and an employer can fire an employee just by saying, "You are fired". But I cannot spend money just by saying "I spend money", I cannot go on strike just by saying "I go on strike", and I cannot obey a military order to attack the enemy just by saying to my superior "I obey your order, Sir". And since, as Searle would undoubtedly agree, spending money, going on strike, and obeying military orders are institutional facts as much as administering death sentences and firing employees are, it follows that, contrary to his main thesis, not all institutional facts are created by speech acts of declaration.

Ironically, this result was prefigured in a passage of The Construction of Social Reality where Searle wrote: "The possibility of creating institutional facts by declaration does not hold for every institutional fact. You cannot, for example, make a touchdown just by saying you are making it." (1995: 55). That is correct, but it clearly contradicts the thesis Searle is now propounding. And, as I have argued, the new thesis cannot be relevantly defended by saying that, although one cannot make a touchdown by a "grounded" declaration, there nevertheless must exist somewhere a "standing" declaration (constitutive rule) that lays down conditions under which touchdowns are possible. For, apart from the fact that Searle now accepts that there can be institutional facts not underwritten by any constitutive rules (23), merely laying down conditions under which facts of a certain sort are possible does not ensure that any fact of that sort (be it a divorce, a death sentence, or a touchdown) is actual.

The second problem is that Searle's central claim that every institutional fact is brought into existence by the performance of a speech act of declaration sits uncomfortably with his parallel requirement that, in order for institutional facts to exist, they must be collectively accepted as existing (85-6, 88, 102-3, 106). Searle appears to believe that the two ideas can be seamlessly combined by taking the acceptance requirement on institutional facts to concern the acceptance of relevant speech acts of declaration (where, presumably, accepting a declaration is supposed to amount not to just disinterestedly accepting that a certain kind of utterance has occurred, but rather to accepting what is said by that utterance -- in other words, accepting the utterance's propositional content).

The problem with the proposed combination, however, is that it renders Searle's account of institutional facts incapable of making any essential use of declarational acts, as Searle has defined them. Recall that a declaration was defined by Searle as a speech act whose speaker (in contrast to the speaker of a mere assertion) makes something the case just by representing it as being the case. It follows, then, that if a speaker's utterance does not make something the case just by representing it as being the case, but is rather such that what it represents as being the case cannot become the case unless other persons (and indeed, unless a whole community) accept that it is in fact the case, then the utterance simply isn't, given the definition, the utterance of a declaration. And since, given the acceptance requirement, the only so-called 'declarations' that Searle would be entitled to appeal to in his account of institutions would be utterances of this last sort, it looks as if no genuine acts of declaration at all could figure in Searle's purported explanation of the creation of institutional reality. (Notice that the issue here is far from terminological: it is one thing to claim, for example, that simply by saying, "You have no right to enter this place", a speaker can make it the case that his hearer does not have a certain right, independently of what the hearer's attitudes might be; it is quite another to claim that, by saying, "You have no right to enter this place", a speaker cannot make it the case that his hearer does not have a certain right unless the hearer accepts that she doesn't have it.)

The problem might be avoidable in a disjunctive account where some institutional facts would be taken to be purely acceptance-dependent and some other institutional facts would be taken to be purely declaration-dependent. However, Searle's commitment to offer a unitary account of institutional facts prevents him from even considering the possibility of a disjunctive account, and that obliges him to face a dilemma: he must either maintain the acceptance requirement on institutional facts but deny that declarational acts have an essential role to play in their creation, or maintain the view that such acts are essentially involved in the creation of institutional facts, but drop the idea that the facts in question cannot exist unless collectively accepted as existing. As far as I can see, the book contains no clue as to how that dilemma could be avoided.

The third problem is that, in order to preserve his central claim's speech act theoretic commitment, Searle is finally forced to make the scope of his account of institutional facts significantly narrower than initially advertised, and to thereby abandon what he was taking the guiding methodological principle of his project to be. As already noted, Searle begins by presenting the book's "main theoretical innovation" as the "very strong theoretical claim" that "all institutional facts" are created by declaration (11). Soon afterwards, however, Searle switches to a heavily qualified version of that claim: he now claims that all of institutional reality "with the important exception of language itself" (12) is created by declaration -- "language itself," he later points outs, is an institutional phenomenon that "is not created by declaration" (110), and the hypothesis that it is so created should be rejected on account of necessitating "an infinite regress" (111). Taken together with Searle's unqualified affirmation that, nevertheless, "language is the fundamental social institution" (113), the heavily qualified version of the "very strong claim" entails that all of institutional reality except its fundamental part is created by declaration -- which, I presume, is what we must take Searle's final position on the matter to be.[2]

Now, the two problems previously raised suggest that, even in this considerably weakened form, Searle's position would be unsatisfactory. But independently of that, the fact that the position Searle is finally led to embrace is so weakened should itself have given him pause, in view of his strongly voiced opinion, presented as the guiding methodological principle of his enterprise, that it is "implausible to suppose that we would use a series of logically independent mechanisms for creating institutional facts" (7). If that is implausible, then embracing the weakened position is itself implausible, since embracing it amounts to accepting that, apart from the declarational mechanism allegedly responsible for the creation of non-linguistic institutions, there must be one or more independent (and so far unspecified) mechanisms responsible for the creation of linguistic ones. It would seem, then, that anyone who takes the extent of institutional reality to be the same as Searle takes it be, and who is committed to discovering the "single mechanism" (7) underlying its creation that Searle has been searching in this book, must begin a new search.

Let us hope that Searle's next book will undertake such a search. In the meantime, the present one may be recommended to newcomers to his philosophy as a lively, if occasionally repetitive, introductory overview of many of his current research themes and of some of his past research achievements.


Searle, J. R. (1995) The Construction of Social Reality. New York: Free Press.

Searle, J. R. (1999) Mind, Language, and Society: Doing Philosophy in the Real World. New York: Basic Books.

Searle, J. R. (2001) Rationality in Action. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Searle, J. R. (2007) Freedom and Neurobiology: Reflections on Free Will, Language, and Political Power. New York: Columbia University Press.

[1] I will be making that assumption in what follows, but I can easily imagine it being questioned. For example, readers who remember that, in earlier works, Searle had spoken of the sorts of declarational acts that he is now taking to be responsible for the existence of extralinguistic institutions as speech acts that "are possible only because of the existence of extralinguistic institutions" (1999: 150) may worry that there is, at the very least, a threat of circularity lurking behind Searle's current enterprise.

[2] It may be asked how, if that is indeed Searle's final position, he could end the book by claiming, in what appears to be a confident reiteration of his opening claim, that "all of human institutional reality" is "created in its initial existence and maintained in its continued existence" by the "single logico-linguistic operation" of "a Status Function Declaration" (201). The answer to this is that, halfway through the book, Searle has issued the warning, "From now on, when I say "institutional fact" I mean "nonlinguistic institutional fact"" (93). Searle's closing claim, then, is only typographically a reiteration of his opening one. In reality, it is not a claim about 'all of institutional reality' at all, but only a claim about that part of institutional reality -- the non-linguistic one -- that, according to Searle, is not fundamental.