Making Things Up

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Karen Bennett, Making Things Up, Oxford University Press, 2017, 260pp., $60.00, ISBN 9780199682683.

Reviewed by Louis deRosset, University of Vermont


It is very plausible to think that the pair set {Socrates, Plato} is somehow generated from Socrates and Plato; that table salt is made up of sodium and chloride; that my head, torso, arms, and legs collectively constitute me; and that the fact that it is both cloudy and chilly is grounded (collectively) in the fact that it is cloudy and the fact that it is chilly. In each case, it seems that something is somehow determined to be or to be the case by some things that make it up, generate, ground, or constitute it.

More generally, philosophers are often moved to consider the question of what “makes up” a certain phenomenon; what “gives rise to”, or “generates” it; what its “source” or “basis” might be; or how it is “constituted” or “constructed.” A number of questions immediately arise, concerning this family of relations. Which relations does it include? What does it take in general for a relation to be included? Is there anything interesting that all members of the family have in common? Karen Bennett’s book attempts to answer these questions. She calls the family of relations the building relations. This book offers the rudiments of a theory of building relations. In particular, Bennett argues that the class is unified, proposes necessary and sufficient conditions for membership in the class, and applies the resulting account to analyze philosophically important notions of fundamentality. The result is an interesting and important defense and development of a distinctive constellation of intricately connected views on some central issues in metaphysics.

Over the course of eight chapters, Bennett argues for seven interesting theses concerning building: (i) there is something important that unifies the class of building relations, so that they form a “reasonably natural” resemblance class; (ii) there is no generic building relation that obtains whenever any more specific building relations obtain; (iii) causation should be included in the class of building relations; (iv) being fundamental in the sense of interest to philosophers is just being unbuilt;1 (v) being more fundamental than something, in the sense of interest to philosophers, is analyzable by appeal to patterns of building relations; (vi) instances of building relations are themselves built; and (vii) some things are built, and so not everything is fundamental.

Bennett provisionally takes building relations to include certain relations that will be relatively familiar to contemporary metaphysicians and philosophers of mind: composition (between parts and wholes), constitution, set formation, realization (of one property or property-instance by another), “microbased determination” (of the properties of a whole by the properties of its parts), and grounding (of one fact by another) (8-12). This seems like a pretty varied bunch of relations. What, if anything, unifies it? Bennett offers two answers (31-2) which, she thinks, establish that the building relations form a “reasonably natural” resemblance class.

First, she argues, the family of building relations can be helpfully characterized:

BUILDING A relation R is a building relation iff:

  1. R is directed: it is irreflexive and antisymmetric;
  2. R is necessitating: if Rxy, then there are circumstances C such that, necessarily, if x obtains (or: exists, occurs, etc.) and C obtains, then y obtains; and
  3. R is generative: if Rxy, then the fact that Rxy makes 'y obtains in virtue of x's obtaining' true (32, 60).

Proposing necessary and sufficient conditions for almost any phenomenon of interest is a perilous business, and readers will find many places to quibble. For instance, the claim that building relations are necessitating is obviously trivializable unless some restriction is imposed on C. (Let C be the fact that y obtains.) Bennett suggests for this purpose that C may not include either y or anything that builds y (52). Two remarks are in order. First, the notion of inclusion is somewhat obscure. So, for instance, it is not clear whether y is included in the fact that y obtains and snow is white; nor whether it is included in the fact that snow is not purple and (either y obtains or snow is purple); nor whether it is included in the fact that Napoleon recognized that y obtains. The second remark is that imposing this restriction on C renders building unfit as a definition or reductive analysis of building, since the notion of building is itself used on the right-hand side. It is not clear that Bennett intends to be providing a reductive analysis. She does take the condition to be informative and to specify in general what makes a given relation R a building relation (when it is) (63). But, though the account carries a whiff of circularity, there is no conclusive reason to think that the fact that Bennett’s specification mentions building relations renders it problematically circular. The fact that building relations must be mentioned certainly does not make Bennett’s account uninformative.

In fact, far from thinking the condition uninformative, readers may have grave doubts about its truth. Bennett discusses doubts already in the literature about whether directedness or necessitation are necessary conditions for R to be a building relation (32-57). But there are doubts about the sufficiency of the right-hand side of building, too. building entails that any relation defined as a restriction of a building relation is also a building relation. So, for instance, if we suppose that R is directed, necessitating, and generative, so too is the relation that obtains between x and y iff Rxy and y is beloved of the Pope. Similarly, the relation that obtains between x and y iff Rxy and y is not beloved of the Pope is a building relation. It is easy to see that these examples can be multiplied. Bennett’s view, then, appears to entail that, as various intuitively irrelevant conditions come to obtain — as the Pope comes to love new things, for instance — things get built in a large number of new ways, and cease to be built in a large number of old ways. This is not particularly plausible; more importantly in the present context, it is not clear that the class of relations delineated by Bennett’s proposed condition is particularly natural.

The underlying problem can be illustrated using examples of relations whose specifications do not mention any building relation. Suppose that, as matters actually stand right now, the Pope’s favorite compound is the Vatican, and his first n favorite buildings are the Sistine Chapel, St. Peter’s, etc. The Vatican is composed of those n buildings. Let’s suppose that composition relations satisfy directedness, necessitation, and generativity. Then the relation that obtains between the x‘s and y iff the x’s are actually now the Pope’s favorite n buildings, and y is actually now the Pope’s favorite compound qualifies as a building relation (with just one instance, eternally and necessarily).2

In fact, just about any class of instances of members of a given class of building relations will yield a relation that satisfies the right-hand side of building.3 Given a class of instances, there is a relation R that obtains between x and y iff 〈x, y〉 is in the class. That relation R will satisfy the right-hand side of building in most cases. So, given a class of building relations, each of which has some instances, it is easy to come up with “gerrymandered” relations that satisfy the right-hand side of building.4 It is not clear that a class that contains the varied multitude of these relations is a fairly natural resemblance class. Perhaps Bennett can patch the account by offering some further necessary condition for something to be a building relation. As matters stand, however, the right-hand side of building seems to be too weak.

The argument just sketched for the conclusion that the right-hand side of building is too weak is significant in the context of Bennett’s argument. The sufficiency of the right-hand side for a relation to qualify as a building relation is the key premise in Bennett’s argument for one of her more surprising main theses: that causation is a building relation (69).5 Bennett considers in depth the question of whether building is objectionable because it classifies causation as a building relation. Ultimately, though she contends that causation is a building relation, she is happy to entertain views on which we amend building or related theses specifically to exclude causation (169). She argues, however, that causation is relevantly similar to grounding, composition, and the other building relations because those other relations are, in her apt phrase, causally “tainted.” Some instances of these relations (she explicitly excludes set-formation) obtain in virtue of diachronic, causal relations. So, for instance, she contends that the made from relation that obtains, e.g., between a cake and the flour, eggs, butter, and sugar from which it is made is a building relation, and that this relation obtains partly in virtue of causal relations between the ingredients and the cake (89-90). She also contends that the composition of an ordinary material object by its particles, and the grounding, microbasing, or realization of that object’s features in features of those particles are examples of building. Moreover, in typical cases the particles compose the object partly in virtue of a complex network of causal interactions. Those causal interactions are also among the conditions in virtue of which the object has its solidity, mass, color, etc.

So, Bennett argues, causation is similar to other building relations, in part because they themselves are causally “tainted”: they relate causal conditions, and sometimes obtain in virtue of causal conditions. She concludes that excluding causation and other causally “tainted” relations from the class of building relations yields a class that “includes set formation, but does not include realization. . . . It includes the relation between [some] Legos and the castle [they compose], but not that between the ingredients and the cake. It includes some but not all instances of grounding, composition, and microbasing” (100). The resulting class of relations “. . . fails to carve reality at the joints” (100). Thus, whether we call causation a building relation or not, the class which contains both causation and the (other) building relations is fairly natural, and the class which excludes both causation and the other causally “tainted” building relations is not natural.

Readers may dispute Bennett’s examples. But her claim that there are building relations that are at least sometimes instantiated diachronically, have causal relata, and obtain in virtue of causal conditions is highly plausible. Still, it is not clear that her argument succeeds. The problem is that a given relation can, in certain instances, have causal relata, and even obtain sometimes in virtue of causal relations, without itself being causally “tainted” in a way that seems to bear on the question of whether it is relevantly similar to causation. So, for instance, it is plausible to think that the fact that the ignition of a fuse caused an explosion grounds the fact that either the ignition caused the explosion or snow is purple. And, on a plausible view about what it is in virtue of which this grounding fact obtains, grounding relates the two facts in virtue of the fact that the ignition caused the explosion. (The view in question is discussed and defended in Ch. 7.) Still, intuitively, these claims don’t seem to provide reason on their own to conclude that the grounding relation itself is causally “tainted” in a way that makes it relevantly similar to causation, or that shows that the class which includes causation and the other building relations is a relatively natural resemblance class. If this argument establishes that grounding is causally “tainted,” then exactly similar arguments show that grounding is “tainted” by a very large class of relations. So, for instance, there is a similar argument for the claim that grounding is mathematically “tainted”, on the basis of the premise that the fact that 2+3=5 grounds the fact that either 2+3=5 or snow is purple. We shouldn’t conclude on this basis that the class of relations which includes the mathematical relations and the building relations, but not, e.g., the causal relations, is a fairly natural resemblance class.

So far, we have been discussing Bennett’s first reason for thinking that the class of building relations is unified: there is, she argues, a relatively simple and informative necessary and sufficient condition for membership in the class. Bennett’s second reason is that the notion of a building relation can be used to offer a reductive account of the kind of fundamentality at issue in metaphysics, ethics, philosophy of mind, and philosophy of science.6 Dualists in the philosophy of mind, for instance, contend that certain psychological phenomena are fundamental; meta-ethical naturalists hold that moral properties are not fundamental; and nowadays most of us think that biological phenomena are less fundamental than physical phenomena. Bennett contends that we can offer a reductive analysis in terms of building of both being fundamental (full stop) and being more fundamental than something. The fact that the notion of building plays this robust theoretical role, Bennett argues, is a symptom that building relations form a natural resemblance class.

Let’s focus on Bennett’s account of relative fundamentality, the relation that obtains between entities x and y when x is more fundamental than y. It might seem as if an analysis of relative fundamentality in terms of building is ready to hand: just say that x is more fundamental than y iff x builds y. Bennett regards this simple proposal as implausible, since it entails that there is no relation of relative fundamentality between entities that are not related by building. For instance, the simple proposal entails that a hydrogen atom in Phoenix is no more fundamental than a water molecule in Ithaca; but the hydrogen atom, Bennett thinks, clearly is more fundamental. What the simple account seems to miss is that one individual can be less fundamental than another by virtue of belonging to a kind which (typically) is built from members of some kind to which the less fundamental thing belongs. The Ithacan water molecule and Phoenician hydrogen atom belong to the kinds water molecules and hydrogen atoms, respectively. Entities of the former kind are typically (in fact, invariably) built from entities of the latter kind. For this reason, it is plausible to think that the Ithacan water molecule is less fundamental (138, 158).

This intuition is part of what drives Bennett to propose a more complicated analysis of relative fundamentality in terms of building. On this analysis, there are five conditions that are individually sufficient and jointly necessary for relative fundamentality. For the sake of brevity, I will explicitly discuss only the fifth condition, which is the one which is supposed to capture the key intuition:7

            (5) If x belongs to some kind K and y belongs to some kind K* such that

                        i.          neither K nor K* includes both built and unbuilt members;

                        ii.         y does not belong to K and x does not belong to K*, and

                        ii.         K*‘s are typically or normally built from K’s,

            then x is more fundamental than y.

Unfortunately, this clause will not serve Bennett’s purposes. The problem is that an individual is a member of many different kinds, and pairs of individuals can be members of pairs of kinds that yield untoward results. Consider , for instance, a disjunctive, psychological fact dp and a non-disjunctive, economic fact ne.  Let K be the kind psychological facts and K  be the kind economic facts. Both kinds, I assume, include only built (in this case, grounded) members. Assuming that ne is not identical with any psychological fact and dp is not identical with any economic fact, each belongs to only one of K and K. Finally, economic facts are, plausibly, typically grounded in psychological facts. So, K and K witness each of (i.)-(iii.), and thus (5) counts dp as more fundamental than ne. Now let K be the kind grounded, non-disjunctive facts, and K the kind disjunctive facts. Again, plausibly, each of (i.)-(iii.) is satisfied,8 so (5) counts ne as more fundamental than dp. But relative fundamentality is asymmetric, so the analysis is in trouble. This case involves grounding, but similar cases can be concocted for composition. So, consider a five-gram mass of table salt (NaCl) in Ithaca and a ten-gram mass of sodium (Na) in Phoenix. Table salt is typically composed (in part) of sodium, and ten-gram masses are typically composed (in part) of five-gram masses. Again, (5) entails that the five grams of table salt are both more fundamental than and less fundamental than the ten grams of sodium.

Bennett acknowledges that her complicated criterion for relative fundamentality is likely to face counter-examples.

One can always fight about the details. Complicated, multi-clause definitions beg to be counterexampled, after all. Perhaps clause (5) requires some further tinkering; perhaps there needs to be an additional clause. I do think this definition is, at a minimum, on the right track (161).9

The phenomenon that causes trouble for (5) is common enough, however, that mere tinkering, adding further qualifications and conditions, is unlikely to yield satisfactory results.

So, I suspect, nothing like (5) is correct. What’s gone wrong? It seems to me that the original intuition concerning the Ithacan water molecule and the Phoenician hydrogen atom is based on a mistake. There are relative fundamentality relations among kinds: water is less fundamental than hydrogen, economic facts are less fundamental than psychological facts, and table salt is less fundamental than sodium. It is tempting to “push down” the relation on kinds to a relative fundamentality relation on their members, as Bennett proposes. But the argument of the previous paragraphs suggests that this temptation should be resisted. It would be better, then, to stick with the simple account of relative fundamentality among individuals. On this view, the Phoenician hydrogen atom is not more fundamental than the Ithacan water molecule. We may still salvage what we can of Bennett’s intuition by offering a separate account — perhaps modeled roughly on clause (iii) of (5) — of relative fundamentality among kinds.

The questions I have raised about some of Bennett’s claims are at best starting points for conversations about critical aspects of the phenomena associated with building and fundamentality. And I have not touched on many of the central themes of the book, which offer fruitful challenges to comfortable orthodoxies on many points. The book contains some real gems, including Bennett’s development and defense of a kind of pluralism about both building and fundamentality (see n. 1 above, and §§2.5, 6.6) and her incisive discussion of the idea of a natural property as developed by Lewis and Sider (§§5.8-5.9). At the current stage of inquiry into the matters Bennett treats, the worth of a book should be measured by the extent to which it advances debates and provides promising new ideas for discussion. I fear that the critical cast of many of my remarks above may obscure the extent to which her book succeeds admirably on both scores. This book makes an important contribution and should be required reading for philosophers working in contemporary metaphysics.


Thanks to Karen Bennett, Mark Moyer, and Justin Zylstra for extensive assistance correcting earlier drafts of this review.

1 Thesis (iv) may seem to be at odds with thesis (ii). The appearance of tension is an artifact of my simplified presentation. Bennett holds that there are as many dimensions of fundamentality as there are building relations, and being fundamental along a given dimension is being unbuilt by the corresponding building relation. Thus, on Bennett’s view, the question of whether I am fundamental (full stop) is misconceived. I am fundamental along the dimension of fundamentality corresponding to set formation by dint of having no members. But I am non-fundamental along the dimension corresponding to mereological composition.

2 Bennett might resist this conclusion on the basis of the fact that the instance of this relation doesn’t “license” any “in virtue of” claim, since noting the instance would not meet the epistemic or pragmatic constraints on “in virtue of” explanations; sometimes she herself characterizes generativity by appeal to the idea of “licensing” explanations (58, 62), and sometimes she does not (see (G), p. 58). But this avenue of resistance would commit Bennett to the idea that such epistemic or pragmatic constraints are part of what makes something a building relation, a claim she clearly rejects (61-2).

3 Not every class of instances is guaranteed to do the trick. If there are x and y and building relations R and S such that Rxy and Syx, then picking the instance 〈x,y〉 of R and 〈y,x〉 of S will not yield a directed relation. Bennett thinks we ought to allow that this sort of case, in which different building relations obtain in different directions, may occur (26-9).

4 The problem I am alleging is not that the relations themselves are gerrymandered; the problem, rather, is that they don’t seem, as a class, to be particularly unified, or to have much in common. I highlight the fact that one can come up with gerrymandered relations satisfying the right-hand side of building only to demonstrate how many and how varied they are.

5 Because the appropriate restriction on C in the statement of clause (2) of building is not made clear, it is not obvious that causation qualifies as a necessitating relation. However, Bennett clearly thinks causation satisfies the right-hand side of building. So, a charitable interpretation of clause (2) of building will require that whatever restriction we eventually place on C will classify causation as necessitating (cf. 80-1). The claim that causation is a building relation is surprising because, on Bennett’s view, it entails the unexpected result that causes are more fundamental along a certain dimension than their effects. So, for instance, if my decision to drive to New Hampshire causes some hydrocarbon chains to undergo combustion, then that decision is more fundamental than the combustion, along a certain dimension of fundamentality.

6 This is a little misleading. As I emphasized in n. 1 above, Bennett’s view is that there are multiple kinds of fundamentality at issue, one for each building relation. Each such kind is used to analyze fundamentality along a corresponding dimension. So, causation is a building relation, and is used by Bennett to analyze causal fundamentality. Composition is also a building relation and is used by Bennett to analyze mereological fundamentality.

7 The condition (5) is intended by Bennett to be schematic over the various dimensions of building; see n. 1. So, we get a sufficient condition for relative fundamentality with respect to composition by substituting “composed” for “built”, and, similarly, for cognate locutions.

8 Here I assume that disjunctive facts are normally grounded in facts that are themselves grounded; if that assumption turns out to be objectionable, we could alter the case so that the kind K we are considering is grounded, non-disjunctive facts and K∗ is disjunctive, psychological facts. Thanks to Justin Zylstra for discussion on this point. 

9 I owe thanks to Bennett for drawing my attention to this passage.