Malebranche: Theological Figure, Being 2

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Alain Badiou, Malebranche: Theological Figure, Being 2, Jason E. Smith and Susan Spitzer (trs.), Columbia University Press, 2019, 193pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231174787.

Reviewed by Ed Pluth, California State University, Chico


This is the latest entry in the series of seminars by Alain Badiou that are being translated and published by Columbia University Press. It is the fourth in the series of twenty chronologically, and the second to appear in English (Lacan: Anti-Philosophy 3 was the first, delivered in the 1994-1995 academic year and published in 2018). The course of which the book is a transcription was given during the first trimester of 1986 (at University of Paris VIII, St. Denis): and it is perhaps not its appearance (given Badiou's stature at this point) but its very existence that comes as some surprise. If there is anyone who has been desperately curious about the relationship between Badiou and the 17th century philosopher, this book must be a welcome surprise. For the rest of us, there are some obvious questions surrounding it. What drove Badiou to dedicate a seminar to Malebranche? And which one was Malebranche again anyway? Wasn't he the occasionalism guy? That Modern Philosophy course was so long ago . . . But there is a question to ask that is more relevant and sympathetic: since this seminar was delivered when Badiou was actively working on Being and Event (1988), maybe it played a hidden role in that book's formation? Is there an underground Malebranche influence there? In his preface to this edition of his seminar, Badiou answers this question rather bluntly: not at all. "This seminar is without a doubt the only one in my entire career that, in terms of the construction of my own system, has been of no use to me" (xxxvii). The clever thing to do here would be to disagree with him, but I can't bring myself to do it, because he's entirely right.

Yet it turns out that the book is a very interesting read, whether one is a fan of Badiou's or not, and some rather interesting things are going on in it. Apart from giving us a thorough and engaging presentation of Malebranche's system, something that should be considered worthwhile in its own right, Badiou is directly dealing here with a topic he rarely covers: theology. The full title of the seminar makes this explicit. The twenty seminars Badiou delivered were sometimes given in thematically coherent clusters: for example, the recently published seminar on Lacan was, as its full title indicates, the third in a series on anti-philosophy. Malebranche is the second installation in a cluster of early seminars he gave on the topic of being, each dealing with what he calls a different "figure" of being in the history of philosophy: ontological (Parmenides), theological (Malebranche), and being as withdrawal/forgetting (Heidegger). Badiou thus puts Malebranche in rather august company, as the French do. He admits that Leibniz would have been the first and more obvious choice for the theological figure of being (not Spinoza?), but he considers Malebranche's system "an intellectual masterpiece of Baroque art, far more honest and pure than Leibniz's propositions" (xxxvi/xxxvii). Moreover, he admires Malebranche's "unflinching courage" on the matter of "the intelligibility of being" (xxxvi). And this also no doubt made him a better choice than Pascal for a treatment of the theological "figure" of being, considering Pascal's view that God is hidden and obscure.

Pascal and Malebranche were contemporaries, and considering their relationship a bit further gives us some insight into why Badiou devoted a seminar to Malebranche. Pascal did merit a chapter in Being and Event after all: Malebranche didn't. What Badiou finds interesting about Pascal is the fact that he was not only a mathematician but that he was also keenly aware of the event-ness of Christianity and of becoming a Christian. Grace is event-like for Pascal, ultimately. This is a view that runs directly counter to Malebranche's: Badiou tells us in his seminar that "in Pascal there is a doctrine of the event, while . . . there is no doctrine of the event in Malebranche, for whom the event is even properly impossible" (26). It becomes clear rather quickly that Malebranche is in fact an antipodal thinker for Badiou, and this is no doubt part of the reason why Badiou was interested in exploring his work. Malebranche is not known as a mathematician either, but what he does with mathematics is also part of the fascination, no doubt. Denying the event-ness of grace, Malebranche makes the occurrence of grace as mechanical as Newton made nature. Indeed, Badiou claims that in Malebranche's system grace, and Christianity as such, are entirely axiomatized and mathematized. That is, there are laws of grace just as there are laws of nature. This is the upshot of Malebranche's important work, The Treatise on Nature and Grace, which is the focus of Badiou's study. (And after all, it would not be impossible to read this title as some variant on Badiou's own Being and Event.)

But Malebranche's flair for mathematization is not enough to establish any relationship between him and Badiou. Because for Malebranche, when it comes to studying being, it is not mathematics that does ontology but one particular organization -- the Catholic Church. For Malebranche, "what sutures the law of being to the infinity of situations . . . is the Church as an organization . . . To think being, you have to think the Church" (25). Pascal famously said in his Pensées that the history of Christianity is the history of truth. Malebranche might have revised that to say that the history of Christianity is the very history of being itself. For "the Church is the body of Christ, not just metaphorically, but in reality, because the Church is really the worldly materiality of God" (148). This is ultimately why Badiou concludes that Malebranche's ontology is not mathematical but a "political ontology" (25). It is "political" due to the fact that it is a specific organization, the Church, that brings about something like the completion or accomplishment of being. This makes Malebranche something of a militant, but unlike the ones Badiou describes in Being and Event, he is a militant for whom there is no contingency, there are no aleatory encounters, and he is someone for whom the equivalent of the state comes to completely dominate all situations. Hence Badiou compares Malebranche's position to that of Stalinism: Malebranche was "very much ahead of his time, a formidable thinker of the Party, in the sense of the communist parties at the time of Stalin. In his thinking there can be found a theory that justifies the endless purges of the party" (149).

Yet Badiou does an excellent job of presenting the overall coherence of Malebranche's thinking, whose systematicity is certainly another reason why he has some admiration for it, and he does so in a neutral manner, without using many of his own central concepts. We don't get much about multiplicity here, or the void, or infinity, but we do get a reference to the four "tresses" of the subject from Theory of the Subject (1982): justice, courage, anxiety, and the superego (175). Badiou wanted to emphasize and promote the dimensions of courage and justice when it comes to subjectivity; he finds that Malebranche laces the subject with anxiety and an overbearing superego. "Whatever way you look at it, whatever way Malebranche colors its figure for us, we always encounter the terrifying nature of his God, whose plan, whatever the marginal ornamentations, appears as a completely narcissistic one, of which we are the instruments" (175).

This description of Malebranche should remind readers of Lacan's account of the sadist, who makes himself into the instrument of the Other's enjoyment. In fact, when he discusses the relationships between God, Christ, the Church, humanity, and creation in Malebranche, Badiou uses a Lacanian framework to a surprising degree. But it is a good fit, since a central issue in Malebranche's work is the question of God's desire, which is of course connected to the topic of grace. Malebranche responds to questions about why grace seems to fall upon the undeserving, seemingly at random, just as rainfall is wasted on oceans when it could be more specifically targeted to places where it is needed (70). His answer, according to Badiou? "Grace will fall like the rain, that is to say, in a general way, which has nothing to do with what it falls on" (120): that is, God acts, and desires, in a general manner, such that "it is important that [humans] understand that it is the general structure of God's desire that is at stake and that they ought not to ask for particular favor" (122). Another indication of Malebranche's Stalinesque sadism.

Consistent with not having a doctrine of the event, Malebranche also has to puzzle out a way in which God can desire, but still not lack.

Malebranche's big problem will be how to think desire without lack. Glory, as we shall see, is ultimately a category of God's desire: what God desires is his own glory. This goes without saying, because if he didn't desire it, he wouldn't make anything, and especially not the world. (85)

Glory is the object of God's desire, and the Church is its instrument, that which is bringing it about. Insofar as the Church spreads itself over existence, God is glorifying himself. And "the world must be as nil as possible" in order for the glory of God, thanks to the Church's work, to be as great as possible: the more destitute and contemptible the world is, the more remarkable its reworking (148). Contra Leibniz, for Malebranche "this world is the most abject of worlds. This explains why this world is the most abject world possible, both materially (it is wretched) and spiritually (it is humiliated)" (89).

Finally, Christ, the intercessor, is for Malebranche something like "God's unconscious" -- the manner in which God forgets himself, and temporalizes his eternal knowledge. Christ possesses something like "a holy ignorance" regarding the situations of individuals, and the whys and wherefores of whether they are deserving of grace: Badiou's read on this is again in Stalinist terms. "If Christ -- or any Party cadre -- knew too much, he could be accused of being wicked, his wickedness consisting in not intervening on the basis of his knowledge" (152).

Given Malebranche's rigorously event-less universe, and his strict theologization of being, it seems that Badiou's interest in him is in large part due to the fact that on nearly every issue they are at polar opposites. Perhaps what Badiou was doing in this seminar can be thought of as something like a thought experiment: what does one end up with without a doctrine of the event, a primarily theological take on being, yet still wishing to mathematize as much as possible (the first two are strictly anti-Badiouian, the third not)? Badiou's opinion -- that there is a foreshadowing of Stalinism in Malebranche's system -- is rather negative, but that does not stop him from admiring the effort. The book reads very well, and the translation is as excellent as one would expect from this team. It is true that anyone looking to understand Badiou better could and should read a number of other texts before this one. But anyone curious about Malebranche, or wishing to recall things they used to know about him, should enjoy Badiou's presentation; and anyone who appreciates solid philosophical exegeses and a bit of intellectual flair should be very entertained and provoked by this seminar as well.