Manifest Activity: Thomas Reid's Theory of Action

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Yaffe, Gideon, Manifest Activity: Thomas Reid's Theory of Action, Oxford University Press, 2004, 167pp, $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 019926855X

Reviewed by Terence Cuneo, Calvin College


Thomas Reid is widely regarded as having made important contributions to philosophy in three broad areas--the philosophy of perception, epistemology, and the theory of human action. Of Reid's contributions to philosophy, the third has been the least explored and, thus, it is especially welcome to have Gideon Yaffe's book length treatment of Reid's theory of action. Yaffe's book is, in my estimation, excellent: it is deftly and concisely argued, resourceful, and offers a charitable interpretation of Reid's position, which by contemporary standards, will seem strange in some of its central contentions. I should add to this, however, that Manifest Activity is also a difficult book to penetrate, as it demands of the reader at least as much expertise in contemporary action theory as it does with Reid's own corpus. Still, the book repays close study, and scholars in both early modern philosophy and contemporary action theory will have much to learn from it.

The central tenet of Reid's philosophy of action, as Yaffe notes, is that the actions of an agent are all and only those events of which the agent is the efficient cause (p. 8). This crisp statement of the heart of Reid's view calls for some explanation, since Reid's use of terminology is different from contemporary usage. An "efficient cause," as Reid uses the term, is not an event, but an entity (indeed, a substance) endowed with "active power," such that for any event of which that entity is a cause, that entity is the originator of the sequence of changes leading to that event. An "active power," accordingly, can be understood to be that quality of an entity by virtue of which that entity is the originator of such an event. Fundamental to Reid's project is the task of identifying the sorts of entity that can be efficient causes. The position on which Reid settles is moderate in some respects and radical in others. Reid's position is moderate insofar as it allows for the existence of some efficient causes (contra Hume), but denies that God is the only efficient cause (contra Malebranche). According to Reid, the class of efficient causes consists in all and only those entities endowed with intellect and will. And this, for Reid, amounts to the claim that God, human beings, and any other similar agents (say, the angels) are the efficient causes. Reid's position is radical, however, inasmuch as it holds that so-called event causation--what Reid calls "physical" causation or causation in the "lax and popular sense"--is really Humean constant conjunction (although there is a nuance to this view that I shall address shortly). This implies that, strictly speaking, Reid denies that events or non-agential substances are causes. When viewed in light of the broad sweep of Reid's thought, this is an interesting concession to Hume. It illustrates the degree to which Reid is willing to break with common sense and ordinary language when philosophical argument and science are, by our best evidence, in conflict with common sense and ordinary language. Indeed, one cannot help but notice that the picture of Reid that emerges from Yaffe's discussion is rather strongly at odds with the popular portrayal of Reid as a not particularly adventurous or innovative philosopher, bent on defending common sense at all costs. The Reid of Yaffe's book traffics in highly controversial and adventurous claims, accepting certain aspects of Humean views about causation and even Meinongianism with regard to abstracta.

How, then, is Reid led to this position regarding powers that is at once moderate and radical? The first two chapters of Manifest Activity argue that Reid is led to this position by embracing some fairly plausible looking claims. The first general thesis that Reid wishes to establish is that an entity has an active power only if it is endowed with both will and understanding. Reid offers two arguments for this claim--"The Argument from the Power to Exert" and "The Argument from the Power to do Otherwise." The first argument is the subject of the book's first chapter, while the second is the subject of the book's second chapter.

The Argument from the Power to Exert clusters around three main claims: first, that we are necessarily active with respect to our choices; second, that we are incapable of conceiving of mental powers possessing subjective, qualitative features different from our own; and, third, that in willing we think about what we will (p. 37). The first main claim is directed against Hobbesians who would deny that power need be active, claiming instead that acts can spring from passive dispositions. Central to Reid's argument against the Hobbesians is the claim that exertions of power are themselves actions and, as such, cannot simply spring from passive dispositions of the agent. The second main claim is interesting, especially in light of Reid's rejection of the claim that conceivability implies possibility. Reid's view appears to be that, while conceivability does not imply possibility, inconceivability--that is, our inability qua human beings to conceive of something--implies impossibility. The third main claim is rooted in the convictions that, necessarily, transitive verbs such as "remembering" and "willing" have objects and that a person engaging in such mental acts ipso facto conceives of these objects. As Yaffe rightly points out, Reid doesn't take this to imply that mental acts such as conception are the objects of noticed awareness; consciousness and noticed awareness, for Reid, needn't go hand in glove. At any rate, the upshot of The Argument from the Power to Exert is that to ascribe active power to ordinary seemingly mindless objects would be a mistake, as it would be to animate the inanimate.

The Argument from the Power to do Otherwise, which Yaffe observes is not developed by Reid in anything like the detail of The Argument from the Power to Exert, hinges on the claim that "power to produce any effect implies power not to produce it" (EAP I.v: 35).[1] To defend this principle from counterexamples such as Locke's famous "man in the locked room" case in which there is a man who has the power to stay in a locked room but not to leave it, Reid, so Yaffe suggests, makes two moves. The first is to defend the principle of

Efficient-Causal Exclusivity: Every event that has an efficient cause has one, and only one, efficient cause.

This principle implies that Locke's man in the locked room is not the cause of his staying in the room. Roughly, the idea is that the man will stay in the room even if he does not exert his power to stay in the room. But if so, then there is a cause of the man's staying in the room other than the man himself. Suppose, now, that the man were to exercise his power to stay in the room. Then there would be two efficient causes of the man's staying in the room, which contravenes Efficient-Causal Exclusivity.

The second move Reid must make is to accept the claim that, if an agent has the power to A and the power not to A, then she has the power to A-rather-than-not A. The thought here is that, if you have, say, the power to make an omelet with the eggs at your disposal, then you also have the power to prevent your making an omelet with the eggs at your disposal; anything that would prevent you from making the omelet-rather-than-not would also prevent you from making the omelet. But if one has the power to make an omelet-rather-than-not, then one has the capacity for preference. This capacity, however, is of a special sort, as it allows us to act in ways that contravene our strongest desires. But to act in such a way is to have practical reason or the power to direct one's conduct in conformance with the dictates of reason. But, if one can do this, one has a will. Accordingly, if Reid can successfully defend these two claims, we have the conclusion that, if something has power, then it has a will.

Having laid out Reid's arguments for the claim that having power requires having intellect and will, the third and fourth chapters examine Reid's claim that there must be an efficient cause of every change in nature. Reid runs two sorts of argument regarding this claim regarding universal efficient causation. On the one hand, Reid argues that the principle of universal efficient causation is a first principle. That is to say, it is a principle we are naturally inclined to accept and also such that we do not accept it on the basis of any inductive or deductive argument. This does not imply, it should be noted, that there are not good arguments for the principle of universal efficient causation. For, on the other hand, Reid wishes to argue that every end-directed event is the product of some entity's exertion of its power to produce the event in question. Central to developing this argument is Reid's so-called third argument for moral liberty. Reid's aim in this argument is to establish that humans are efficient causes of their actions from the fact that they can make and execute plans. In a piece of fascinating philosophical excavation drawing widely from Reid's work, Yaffe argues that, if we agree with certain assumptions Reid makes about the nature of character traits, viz., that they are fixed resolutions to conform to a rule, then this puzzling argument can receive a substantial defense.

The last three chapters of the book address more directly issues regarding human agency. At issue is a two-part worry regarding the status of motives in Reid's thought. Motives cannot be efficient causes, for that would violate the principle of Efficient-Causal Exclusivity. Nor, according to Yaffe, can motives be so-called physical causes, as this would violate Reid's stricture that the "actions of men … are not phenomena of nature" (C: 255). Reid's solution to the first worry is to claim that motives are not mental states such as desires, but the objects of such states and that, strictly speaking, the objects of these states don't exist, as they are abstracta of a certain kind. If this is right, Reid is committed to a type of Meinongianism with respect to motives. The solution to the second worry is to argue, first, that there is no non-trivial way to specify the laws that would characterize human behavior, were motives physical causes; second, that motives cannot in general be physical causes of action since we sometimes act with no motive at all; and, third, that motives function analogously to advice, which is different from the influence of physical causes. If motives were physically caused, they would not prompt the agent to act under his own power. (Here, it should be noted, Reid is using the term "motive" in a different sense to stand for mental states.)

The interest in Reid's theory of action in the philosophical literature has generally been concerned to explicate his theory of agent causation and evaluate whether it can withstand certain types of criticism, preeminent among which is that it commits Reid to an infinite regress of agent causes. In short, according to this criticism, Reid thinks that any agent who has the power to act in a certain way also has the power to exert that power. Suppose, though, that this power is exercised only through exertion. If so, then a regress threatens.

The last chapter addresses these concerns and some of the relevant literature. Yaffe defends the novel position that Reid is an agent causalist who believes there is a basic causal relation between agents and events, but not because this is necessary to solve the problem of there being an infinite regress of acts. According to Yaffe's interpretation of Reid, when an agent succeeds in doing something he tried to do, his trying is not a separate action distinct from his doing it; rather, his trying and his doing are identical. However, when an agent fails to do something he tried to do, then clearly an agent's trying is not identical with his doing; in this case, the exertion of his power is his act, and he is the efficient cause of it. If this is right, says Yaffe, there is no regress about which to worry, for there is only the efficient causal relation of the agent to his exertion.

Although it comprises only a short section of the book's discussion, I suspect that what Yaffe argues in the last chapter of his book will provoke the most discussion among scholars interested in Reid's theory of action since it engages with an ongoing and lively debate. I want to close, however, by addressing what Yaffe says about the influence of motives. For it seems to me that the picture offered of Reid's view may be a little too tidy and leaves an interesting question regarding Reid's position unresolved.

Central to Yaffe's discussion in chapters five and six is the claim that motives are for Reid the objects of mental states and not the mental states themselves. I think this is to oversimplify the issue, mainly because Reid's discussion in essays two and three of Essays on the Active Powers strongly suggests that Reid had in mind by the term "motive" both mental states and the objects thereof. Suppose, then, for ease of reference, we adopt terminology that Reid himself uses at times and call those mental states that incline us to action--what Reid called the mechanical and the animal principles--"incitements" and the objects of such states "motives." Having this distinction before us is helpful, I want to suggest, because it forces us to come to grips with the role of incitements in human action. Yaffe's interpretation of Reid tells us that the affections are neither motives strictly speaking (as they are not the objects of thought) nor physical causes of human action (human action being caused only by the agent himself). But if they are neither, it is difficult to see what motivational role incitements could play in the production of human action. (In Yaffe's view, they don't seem to play the role of advice, that role being reserved for motives strictly so-called.) And yet Reid himself insists that the incitements play a crucial role in human action, for "if there were no incitements to action, active power would be given in vain" (EAP III.i.i: 95). Indeed, Reid claims that incitements such as the benevolent affections invariably accompany moral judgment-- "moral approbation" being, in fact, a unified state consisting of moral judgment, benevolent affection, and feeling (see EAP III.iii.viii). Actions performed on the basis of moral judgments are paradigmatically free actions for Reid, however. So, we're left with a puzzle: if those moral judgments on the basis of which free action is taken are invariably accompanied by incitements such as the animal principles, and these principles play an important motivational role, then exactly what motivational role do these principles play?

I don't see an answer to this question in Yaffe's discussion, although two possibilities spring to mind. One option would be to say that the affections incline us to action, but deny that their mode of influence is causal, claiming instead that it is sui generis. After all, it doesn't strictly follow that if a mental state inclines an agent to perform an act A, then that mental state is thereby a physical cause of A in Reid's sense. For there may be no projectible law that can be formulated that links the affection and the action--counterfactuals such as "if S were not active with respect to A, then mental state M would cause S to A" coming out false by virtue of the fact that in such a case A would not count as a human action. But, I think it should be conceded that, all other things being equal, this option is not particularly attractive, as it inflates Reid's ontology with non-causal sources of influence and does not receive clear textual support. Another option would be to agree that affections can be physical causes of human action, although in a qualified sense. In particular, they may function in a similar fashion to what J. L. Mackie called an "inus condition"--an insufficient but nonredundant part of an unnecessary but sufficient condition of some effect. The basic idea is that a mental state such as an affection plays a partial, contributory causal role in human action that is contingent upon the exercise of active power. If we understand the term "inclines" to denote a species of physical causation, one way to formulate this view would be as follows: a mental state M inclines an agent S to A just in case were S to exercise his active power, then M and S would jointly cause A.

The main problem with this suggestion is that physical causation is, at bottom, a species of efficient causation for Reid, all such causation ultimately being the product of God's (or some other subordinate agent's) having exercised his active power. And, thus, the suggestion under consideration contravenes the principle of Efficient-Causal Exclusivity, the claim that every event that has an efficient cause has one, and only one, efficient cause. But given the importance of finding a genuine motivational role for incitements such as the affections in Reid's theory of action, this may mean that we simply have to modify the principle of Efficient-Causal Exclusivity so that it tells us that every event that has an efficient cause has one, and only one, sufficient efficient cause. This modification would allow that agents and their motivations can jointly comprise a sufficient efficient cause for certain events and that motives themselves cannot cause actions strictly so-called. (Recall that a physical cause is, for Reid, at bottom an efficient cause.) So far as I can see, this modification of the aforementioned principle is compatible with The Argument from the Power to do Otherwise, Reid's texts cited in favor of the principle of Efficient-Causal Exclusivity, and even the idea that motives function as "advice." Indeed, it is worth stressing that Reid himself appears to allow for shared causal responsibility in action. For example, Reid is clear that although an agent's exercise of his active power is sufficient for her to will her arm to move, the moving of the arm takes the cooperation of other causes (see EAP I.vii: 51). And, in at least one place Reid says that there are cases when "we impute the action, partly to the man, and partly to the passion" (EAP II.ii: 74), which suggests that Reid has a supple enough account of action to allow for cases in which such events are the upshot of multiple causes.

The foregoing, at any rate, indicates a line of thought that might be pursued if we are to address an issue that Yaffe's discussion leaves unresolved. The point to underscore in closing, however, is that Yaffe has done Reid scholars the favor of casting a great deal of light on Reid's theory of action in a probing and insightful way. Manifest Activity is a book that should delight those interested in Reid's theory of action.[2]

[1] References to The Correspondence of Thomas Reid (C) are to the volume edited by Paul Wood (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 2002). References to Essays on the Active Powers of the Human Mind (EAP) are to the version edited by Baruch Brody (Cambridge, Mass: MIT Press, 1969). Citations from the Essays follow an abbreviated title, essay, chapter, page number format. (The exception to this is references to EAP essay III, which follow an essay, chapter, section, and page number format.) Quotations from Reid in the text are followed by parenthetical references in the text to the relevant passage from Reid's work.

[2] Thanks to Erika Cuneo, Ryan Nichols, and Gideon Yaffe for their comments on a version of this review.