Manifest Reality: Kant's Idealism and His Realism

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Lucy Allais, Manifest Reality: Kant's Idealism and His Realism, Oxford University Press, 2015, 329pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198747130.

Reviewed by Kris McDaniel, Syracuse University


This book is terrific. In it one finds a plausible account of transcendental idealism, supported by arguments that are refreshingly clear yet powerful. It provides an excellent overview of a wide range of competing interpretations, each of which is sympathetically presented but also subjected to serious objections. It would be near impossible to survey all the ways in which Kant's transcendental idealism has been interpreted, but this book provides an excellent overview of many of them, and hence is welcome resource for both beginners and experts. Although some of these interpretations, e.g., Kant as a phenomenalist, are decisively refuted, Allais is rhetorically temperate throughout. Finally, it is a pleasure to read, and how often does one say this about a work on Kant? If you are interested in Kant's transcendental idealism, this book is not to be missed.

The book is divided into three main parts. In the first, Allais presents and argues against competing interpretations of transcendental idealism that range from highly deflationary views according to which Kant's distinction between things in themselves and things as they appear is in no-way a metaphysical distinction but rather is merely a distinction between ways of considering the same things, to highly metaphysical views according to which the distinction is between an unknowable set of non-spatiotemporal "noumenal" entities and constructions out of sense-data.

In the second and third parts, Allais develops her own positive interpretation, according to which, roughly, the distinction between things as they appear and things in themselves is a distinction between things having essentially manifest qualities and things having qualities that are not essentially manifest, including intrinsic natures. An essentially manifest quality is, as its name suggests, a quality that as a matter of its essence is possibly manifested to finite creatures such as ourselves. I take it that if a property is essentially manifest, it is never instantiated in a possible world that lacks finite creatures like ourselves, although it might be instantiated in a world in which finite creatures do not actually perceive it.

In the course of defending her interpretation of transcendental idealism, Allais defends several other notable claims. Among them is a non-conceptualist account of intuitions, which I found convincing; the claim that the goal of the Transcendental Deduction is to show that empirical concept application is possible only if the application of a priori concepts is possible (p. 168), which I found highly plausible; and that the reason that empirical concept application requires the application of a priori concepts is that otherwise we would have no way of distinguishing between stable empirical objects and gerrymandered or gruesome ones (pp. 275-285), which I found intriguing and am still mulling over. This is a very rich book -- there's far more in it than can be covered in a single review, and it repays close study.

Both Allais's criticisms of alternative views and arguments for her own interpretation are grounded almost entirely by appeal to passages appearing in the Critique of Pure Reason and the Prolegomena. Notably, she only occasionally appeals to the lecture notes of Kant's courses, his correspondence with other philosophers, or the other works that constitute Kant's literary remains. It is undeniable that the texts she focuses on are the central ones on which an interpretation of Kant's transcendental idealism must be based. One must exercise caution and restraint when drawing on the material I mention. But the texts she focuses on are in no way easy to interpret, and so drawing on this other material can be useful. Later in this review, I will briefly discuss some interesting passages from this material, some of which are helpful to her interpretations and some of which are perhaps not.

One aspect of Allais's view that is not clear to me is whether she takes "appearances" and "things that appear" to be co-extensive terms. On page 19, she does say that "appearance" is short hand for "things as they appear to us", but this does not seem to me obviously right. If appearances simply are the things that appear, and these same things are can be also be considered in themselves, then plausibly appearances can exist independently of whether they in fact appear (although in such circumstances it would not be apt to call them "appearances") and exist in possible worlds without finite creatures like ourselves. But if appearances are the manifest qualities that things have when they appear, then plausibly appearances themselves are mind-dependent in a strong sense: they do not exist in worlds in which we do not exist. The latter interpretation of Allais is supported by several passages in which she tells us that spatiotemporal things are mind-dependent (for example, pp. 13-14). Moreover, there are passages in Allais in which she does seem to identify appearances with aspects (for example, pp. 28, 287) and with relational properties (for example, p. 69). On the other hand, there are passages in which Allais denies that appearances are properties; see pp. 135-136. The view in those pages seems to be that appearances are objects that are constituted by essentially manifest properties rather than being the properties themselves. This strikes me as an importantly different view, since on it there is a distinction between kinds of objects rather than between two kinds of aspects of one kind of object.[1]

Whether appearances are things having manifest properties or the properties themselves is more a question of terminology than of ontology, but being sensitive to this difference is, I think, in many ways helpful to Allais's interpretation.[2] Note that there are passages from outside the canonical texts in which Kant appears to assimilate appearances with properties rather than things having these properties. Here are some worth considering:

Now since . . . nothing is simple in space, every body and every matter is infinitely divisible . . . every appearance is thus a continuous quantum. But are substances nonetheless simple? Of course! But when I see bodies, then I see no substances, but rather appearances. I cannot at all perceive the substances, for no being, other than the creator alone can perceive the substances of another thing [28: 204, 2001: 27].

Matter is also no substance, but rather only a phenomenon of substance. That which remains in appearance, what underlies the manifold of the body, we call substance [28: 209, 2001: 31].

Substance is therefore also called the substrate of appearances, and is the first, for I can think of the substance or subject without accident or predicate, but not the reverse [29: 769, 2001: 177].

For the sensible world lies merely in my senses. These, however, show us only the manner in which they are affected by the things, but not the latter themselves. They show us merely the appearances of the things. But these are not the things themselves. They indeed underlie the appearances, and I can surely infer the actuality of things from the appearances . . . [29: 857, 2001: 214].

But here matter means only the appearance of outer things, these we indeed find lifeless, but we do not cognize whether the substances that underlie them perhaps contain life [28: 442, 2001: 290].

Note that, in these passages, appearances are treated as something akin to aspects -- as Kant also does with phenomena in his Inaugural Dissertation -- that inhere in substances that underlie the appearances.[3] But note also that although in these passages appearances are not identified with "the things themselves", the metaphysics expressed is still remarkably similar to the metaphysics attributed to Kant by Allais: a metaphysics of things having manifest properties (appearances) as well as other non-manifest (and unknown to us) properties. Finally, note that in these passages Kant offers a seemingly different explanation of why we are entitled to believe in the reality of things in themselves given appearances than the one offered by Allais. Allais claims that Kant holds that it is a conceptual truth that whenever something has relational properties, it also has non-relational properties.[4] But in the passages above, the inference is from the existence of properties (appearances) to the existence of things that have them (the substances).[5] Perhaps such substances must have further properties, but it is not clearly a conceptual truth that they must. One might reasonably wonder if insisting that they must conflicts with the spirit of Kant's claim that we have no knowledge of things in themselves. But we can also note the explanation that Kant offers in the above passages is compatible with explanation Allais offers: they are different but not necessarily in competition.

According to Allais (p. 296), by the end of the Transcendental Aesthetic, Kant has completed an argument for transcendental idealism; in her words, "Kant's transcendental idealism is entirely established in the Aesthetic". On her view, there is no new argument for transcendental idealism to be found in the Transcendental Analytic; nor is Kant's argument for transcendental idealism completed only by the end of the Transcendental Analytic. (She does grant (p. 176, ft. 1) that there are further arguments for transcendental idealism in the Dialectic.) On her view, Kant in no way commits himself to further claims about the mind-dependence of objects or their properties in the Transcendental Analytic. Instead, the argument developed through the Transcendental Deduction is an epistemological argument rather than one with metaphysical consequences.

There is some textual evidence against this part of Allais's view. In a footnote to the second edition of the Critique, Kant appears to tell us that transcendental idealism will be proved "not hypothetically but rather apodictically from the constitution of our representations of space and time and from the elementary concepts of the understanding" [Bxxii, CPR: 113].

Kant seems to say here that his main argument for transcendental idealism will have two different sets of premises: one set concerning the representations of space and time and the other set concerning the concepts of the understanding. Paul Guyer also discusses this passage in Guyer (1987, p. 343), but Guyer thinks that, in this passage, Kant indicates that he will provide two independent arguments for transcendental idealism, one that concerns space and time, and a distinct argument based on claims about the categories. But we both agree that part (perhaps an improper part!) of Kant's case for transcendental idealism appears in the Transcendental Analytic.

One of the things at issue here is whether we should think that categorical properties, such as causality, are essentially manifest properties. It is clear that Kant denies that (in some sense) the principles defended in the Analytic of Principles apply to things in themselves. But what does this mean, especially for the proponent of Allais's position? Consider, for example, the following remarks:

But herein lies just the experiment providing a checkup on the truth of the result of that first assessment of our rational cognition a priori, namely that such cognition reaches appearances only, leaving the thing in itself as something actual for itself but uncognized by us [Bxx, CPR: 112].

But even if we could say anything synthetically about things in themselves through the pure understanding (which is nevertheless impossible), this still could not be related to appearances at all, which do not represent things in themselves [A277/B333, CPR: 375].

We will see in the following that synthetic a priori cognitions have a validity insofar as they are principles of the possibility of experience. . . . How is experience possible, or how does the understanding make cognitions of things from perceptions? It must have principles which are synthetic propositions . . . It [the principle of causality] is valid for all objects of experience and we will see that it cannot be proved other than as a proposition which is valid for all objects of experience, but not beyond them, and so it is with all synthetic a priori propositions; and all mistakes in metaphysics consist in this, that propositions that apply only to experience are used beyond this, for they are nevertheless valid only for all possible objects of experience, not for things in themselves [29: 815, 2001: 169].

Representing is sensible insofar as the object is represented by the subject as appearance. Representing is intellectual, on the other hand, insofar as the object is considered through the representation as it is in itself [29: 971-972, 2001: 442]. . . . Extensions of our a priori cognitions are possible only through synthetic a priori judgments [29: 973, 2001: 443] . . . But synthetic a priori propositions can be referred to objects only as they exhibit themselves in appearance. For otherwise they would be intellectual, and there would not be any pure intuition. They are therefore possible only if the a priori proposition contains nothing else than the a priori object insofar as it is appearance [29: 973, 2001: 444].

Here's the concern in a nutshell: If (1) appearances are identical with the things that appear, and (2) the things that appear are also things that can be considered in themselves, and (3) appearances can be known to instantiate categorical properties (in accordance with various known synthetic principles), and (4) categorical properties are not essentially manifest properties (or in some other way mind-dependent properties), then in what sense do we fail to have knowledge of things that can be considered as they are in themselves?

Allais interprets Kant's claim that space and time do not pertain to things in themselves as tantamount to the claim that spatiality and temporality are essentially manifest properties. A natural extension of this interpretation to categorical properties is that they are also essentially manifest properties. This natural extension would give us a uniform way of understanding claims of the form Fness does not pertain to things in themselves, namely, that Fness is an essentially manifest property. This would be to deny (4) above, which I grant would soothe the concern. And it would make sense of Bxxii, CPR: 113, in which Kant seems to claim that part of the case for transcendental idealism is not established until the conclusion of the Transcendental Analytic.

This is not the route that Allais takes. Her denial that there are further claims about mind-dependence in the Transcendental Analytic implies that categorical properties are not essentially manifest properties.[6] She commits herself to (4). In light of the earlier discussion, I think she should deny (1). Appearances rather than the things that appear are the objects subsumed under the synthetic principles concerning the categories. Our knowledge of the categorical properties and relations of appearances does not license an extension of these synthetic claims to the things in which the appearances inhere. And in fact, this seems to be the position that Allais endorses (pp. 296-297).

Let me conclude this review as I began it: with enthusiastic praise for this book. I highly recommend it.


I thank Lucy Allais, Andrew Chignell, and Colin Marshall for helpful comments on this review.


Guyer, Paul. 1987. Kant and the Claims of Knowledge, Cambridge University Press.

Kant, Immanuel. 2001. Lectures on Metaphysics, translated by Karl Ameriks, Cambridge University Press.

Kant, Immanuel. 2003. Theoretical Philosophy 1755-1770, translated by David Walford and Ralf Meerbote, Cambridge University Press.

Langton, Rae. 1998. Kantian Humility, Oxford University Press.

Marshall, Colin. 2013. "Kant's Appearances and Things in Themselves as Qua-Objects", Philosophical Quarterly 63: 252: 520-545.

McDaniel, Kris. 2015. "A Philosophical Model of the Relation between Things in Themselves and Appearances", Noûs 49.4: 643-664.

Stang, Nicholas. 2013. "The Non-Identity of Appearances and Things in Themselves", Noûs 47.4:106-136.

[1] That said, I have sympathy with this view; see Marshall (2013), McDaniel (2015), and Stang (2013) for ways in which something like this view could be further developed.

[2] Though, as noted above, it is a question of ontology whether there is a set of things constituted by appearance properties.

[3] Kant writes, "Now, although phenomena, properly speaking, are aspects of things and not ideas, and although they do not express the internal and absolute quality of objects, nonetheless cognition of them is in the highest degree true" [2: 397, 2003: 389].

[4] See, e.g., Allais pp. 69-70.

[5] If appearances are properties of things, then surely we can infer the actuality of things from their appearances: if a property is instantiated, then there is an actual thing doing the instantiating; compare with Langton (1998), pp. 21-22.

[6] One might worry about calling categorical properties manifest since there is nothing that, e.g., causation looks like per se, and this is why the categories must be schematized. Set this concern aside. The fundamental issue I am concerned with is whether categorical properties are in some mind-dependent: are there worlds in which these properties are instantiated but in which no finite creatures like ourselves exist?