Manipulated Agents: A Window to Moral Responsibility

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Alfred R. Mele, Manipulated Agents: A Window to Moral Responsibility, Oxford University Press, 2019, 192pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190927967.

Reviewed by Christian Helmut Wenzel, National Taiwan University


This is a short book of 174 pages and in large print. Over the years, Alfred Mele has written many books on free will, and this new one draws much on his earlier 1995 Autonomous Agents: From Self-Control to Autonomy and his 2006 Free Will and Luck. The basic aim of the new book is to respond to critics and to test and examine our intuitions about moral responsibility by considering examples. Each example concerns a pair, involving a normal agent and a manipulated agent, who are roughly identical at a certain time of action, say for one day, but have very different histories before that day. Say, one has always been good (Sally) and the other bad (Chuck), but then one of them is manipulated just before that day and turned into a sort of twin of the other. We are asked whether we find them equally guilty if the action in question is bad (Sally manipulated in the scenario One Bad Day, and Chuck not manipulated). In a reverse case we are asked whether we find them equally praiseworthy if the action is good (Sally not manipulated, and Chuck manipulated in the scenario One Good Day). Mele himself finds the manipulated agent not morally responsible for the act, even though both agents commit the same act and are roughly identical as far as the relevant mental states are concerned on that day. Throughout the book, these examples are modified to suit various positions, assumptions, and counterarguments. Thus, the character formation and the manipulation can be strong, weak, or probabilistic, and lead to more or less "unsheddable" values and more or less "Luther-style" versions of "could not have done otherwise." It is Mele's overall aim to show that history matters and that compatibilists can avail themselves of such considerations.

The book is meant to help compatibilists against the incompatibilists' claim that compatibilists have no satisfying account of what the conditions are for a person to have free will and to be morally responsible in a deterministic world. A compatibilist, following Mele's suggestion, may include historical, "externalist" conditions and need not limit the scope to "internalist" conditions at the time of action. "Externalism," if I understand Mele correctly, here means two things, namely, to include causes that have their sources (spatially) external to the agent and that lie way in the past and are in that sense (temporally) external to the agent at the time of action. Thus, Mele finds the cases of Sally and Chuck asymmetric. He finds Sally in One Bad Day not guilty and Chuck guilty, although they are identical as far as their relevant states of mind at the time of action are concerned; and he finds Chuck in One Good Day not praiseworthy and Sally praiseworthy, again although they are identical as far as their relevant states of mind at the time of action are concerned. If we share his intuitions, then the asymmetry is due to their histories before the day of manipulation and action. I find the examples convincing and I share Mele's intuitions. Of course, there are many subtle problems about what exactly the "relevant states of mind" are, and Mele spends time going into some detail. There are also problems about personal identity over time; here again Mele, successfully I think, defends his position.

Mele begins by presenting Robert Kane's claim of thirty years ago that compatibilists cannot give a satisfying account of freedom in such a way as "to ensure against the success of any potential covert non-constraining (CNC) control of the agent's will by another agent" (Kane, Free Will and Values, 1985, p. 1). According to Kane, compatibilists are vulnerable to manipulation arguments. He further claims that such control (manipulation) by another agent is impossible if we assume indeterminism. Mele shows both claims to be false, I think convincingly, by means of his Sally-Chuck example and suitable probabilistic variations of it. First, although compatibilists cannot "ensure against the success" of such a controller, they still can find Sally in One Bad Day not guilty and Chuck in One Good Day not praiseworthy. There is control over the action, but not control over our judgment, so to speak. Compatibilists are free to include the histories of Sally and Chuck. Second, Mele shows that manipulation is possible also in indeterminist worlds (pp. 86, 103, 123-125). I agree with Mele on both accounts. I would even question the idea of CNC from the start. Even if the agent does not notice the manipulation, I would be hesitant to call it "non-constraining." According to my intuition, the manipulation can be seen to be constraining if it works strongly against the character and values of the agent before the manipulation. Here, of course, I include the history of the agent and I assume identity over time.

The main thrust in the beginning of Mele's book is against Frankfurt's internalism. Mele quotes Frankfurt saying that "the question of how the actions and his [the agent's] identifications with their springs are caused are irrelevant to the question of whether he performs the actions freely or is morally responsible for performing them" (Frankfurt, The Importance of What We Care About 1988, p. 6); and "if someone does something because he wants to do it, and if he has no reservations about that desire but is wholeheartedly behind it, then -- so far as his moral responsibility for doing it is concerned -- it really does not matter how he got that way" (Frankfurt, "Reply to John Martin Fischer" 2002, p. 6). Mele introduces his Sally and Chuck cases to show that, contrary to Frankfurt, it does matter to us and to our judgment about moral responsibility "how the actions and his identifications with their springs are caused" and "how he got that way" (italics mine). History matters. Again, I agree with Mele. But it also seems to me that Frankfurt could defend himself by giving the expressions "his identifications" and "he wants it" a history-sensitive reading. Frankfurt could say that the manipulated Sally in One Bad Day does not really identify and does not really want it. Sally that day is not herself in some sense. But I do not know whether Frankfurt would agree to such a move. If he does not, it seems to me that Mele's criticism is correct.

In relatively long chapter 3, Mele defends his position against claims made by Michael McKenna and Manuel Vargas. He introduces further cases, Anne and Beth, and Pat and Paul, instant agents, and minutelings, and he embarks on discussions about "practically unsheddable values," "compulsion*," "ideally self-controlled agents," "compelled innate pro-attitude," and "autonomy." I must admit that I found this chapter at times somewhat technical and difficult to follow. This might not be Mele's fault though; he tries to be clear. It seems to me that there is a general methodological problem about giving definitions and general accounts while relying on readers' intuitions. I will come back to this point at the end of my review.

In chapter 4, Mele returns to Frankfurt and quotes additional internalist positions, by Richard Double and Gary Watson. He briefly goes through their views and claims one by one, and again argues that compatibilists do not need to be internalists but can avail themselves of externalist considerations. When following Mele's arguments, we should keep in mind that he himself is not a convinced compatibilist. He remarks early on: "For the record, I am officially agnostic about compatibilism, both about free will and about moral responsibility" (p. 3).

Chapter 5 is about "bullet biting." If compatibilists share Mele's intuition that Sally in One Bad Day and Chuck in One Good Day are not morally responsible, must they nevertheless bite the bullet and find them morally responsible because they are compatibilists? To argue that they don't, Mele repeats some of his arguments and offers additional details on why he thinks we find the manipulated Sally and Chuck not morally responsible and what the differences to their non-manipulated counterparts are, and he argues that determinism does not matter in these considerations. Hence, compatibilists can embrace externalism. He also includes zygote arguments (Ernie and Bernie) in deterministic worlds and similarly argues that determinism does not matter. In zygote arguments, a superhuman demon Diana creates a zygote Ernie in Mary with the intention that Ernie will commit a certain crime thirty years later. Bernie is similar to Ernie, he commits the same crime, but he comes into existence in the natural way and is not created by a demon. As Fischer and Mele have argued earlier, our intuitions waver, depending on how powerful the creators are, i.e., to what degree they can intentionally bring about something in the far future by doing something at the moment of creation. If the power is weak (Fischer), we might find Ernie morally responsible; whereas if the power is strong and even superhuman (Mele), we might find him not morally responsible. If we introduce intermediate cases, we might not know how to judge the situation and reach a stalemate (Fischer). For Mele, the Zygote argument remains open to discussion, and he looks forward to more worked-out positive accounts for moral responsibility: "I, for one, would love to see an argument that convinces me that Ernie is morally responsible for some of what he does and moves me to abandon my agnosticism in favor of compatibilism" (p. 113-114).

In the last chapter, he returns to the remark by Kane that I mentioned at the beginning of this review and "wraps things up." He introduces a "crude sketch" of "direct moral responsibility" (responsibility that is not wholly inherited from other things) and argues that it must include some external conditions. In this last chapter, Mele offers a list of twelve questions for his account and gives answers.

This is a rich book. I find the examples very helpful and stimulating for testing and questioning our intuitions and trying to understand what exactly we mean by "free will" and "moral responsibility." But when it comes to introducing (sometimes technical) definitions and giving general accounts and arguments, especially when this involves distinguishing between different cases and introducing additional conditions, I must admit that I sometimes tend to lose sight of my intuition while reading and find the argument at places difficult to follow. Such accounts remind me of legal contracts. Maybe this is necessary. But I am not sure. Kant said that in mathematics the definitions are at the beginning, while in philosophy they are at the end. In analytic philosophy one tries to give definitions early on to make for clarity. I have a PhD in pure mathematics and I believe that I have an idea about clarity. But philosophy is not mathematics. In philosophy, especially analytic philosophy, I sometimes encounter definitions early on in a text that appear to be clear on first blush but that I later on find to be not clear, because they rely on other terms that are equally problematic. While reading Mele's book, I encountered this problem several times. Mele makes an effort to clarify some general expressions, for instance the term "unsheddable value," i.e., what McKenna means by it, what he himself means by it, and what the differences are. But such discussions can be difficult to follow. When several terms that have such problems are employed in a single argument, it can be difficult to follow the argument while relying on one's intuition. I think the later Wittgenstein was keenly aware of this problem. It seems to me to be a general problem in philosophy. I think "control," "free will," and "moral responsibility" are prototype and exemplar concepts, and hence trying to come up with necessary and sufficient conditions will, in the end, not be successful.

And there is an additional problem. Mele does not have a fixed and decided position as do Kane or Pereboom. He is more open and undecided. He believes in free will and moral responsibility, but he is agnostic about compatibilism and incompatibilism. Hence his arguments are often more complex, because he fights on several fronts at the same time, leaving room for several possibilities. His position is more difficult to grasp. I myself used to be a hard determinist, since my high-school days. But recently, I find myself closer to Mele's open and undecided position. Maybe that is progress. I believe it is.

Mele's book is a short and very good one. His position reflects much experience in the field and is sophisticated (in a good sense). I see its value in the well-chosen examples and the helpful discussions of them. As Kant said, definitions come at the end, and maybe there is no end to philosophy.