Marketing Ethics

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George G. Brenkert, Marketing Ethics, Blackwell, 2008, 256pp., $35.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780631214236.

Reviewed by Patrick E. Murphy, University of Notre Dame


George Brenkert's book provides an in-depth examination of a number of selected topics on the subject of marketing ethics. He purposely has not positioned this work as a survey of the field. The hallmark of the book's five chapters is his pragmatic/practical and pluralistic approach. Several times he makes a strong point that his coverage teases out the complexities of this multi-faceted subject. He criticizes other approaches that are characterized as formulaic or simplistic. Illustrations of this type of criticism are the Golden Rule and the newspaper/TV test. Although Brenkert is trained in philosophy and not in business, he does draw heavily on the work of several academic "gurus" in marketing -- Philip Kotler, the late Theodore Levitt and Shelby Hunt. This review will briefly summarize some of the key issues examined in each chapter and then move to more critical comments.

In chapter 1 Brenkert sets the stage for the material to follow and begins fittingly with ethical criticisms and defenses of the marketing field. Early on the author evaluates the three American Marketing Association definitions of marketing and makes several critical observations about their lack of ethical emphasis. He outlines four features of his understanding of marketing: goal-oriented action, capacity for responsible choice, instrumental relatedness and competition. He makes an important observation that questions of justice and fairness are an inherent part of marketing. Rather than build on any particular ethical theory, Brenkert offers six "middle level" principles or values as the building blocks for his pluralistic conception of marketing: autonomy, freedom, justice, trust, truth and well being. He concludes this chapter by stating that "marketing ethics must consider all those relevantly involved" (p. 37) but only mentions stakeholder theory in passing.

The second chapter is central to the book, because Brenkert discusses, in depth, the "integrated marketing concept" which he contrasts with other conceptions of marketing. He examines several pillars of this integrated marketing concept, which requires an integration of the values and norms of marketers and consumers. A second topic this chapter deals with is marketing research. Those conducting research in marketing need to be respectful of their subjects and draw upon the six principles he proposes in the first chapter. A third topic is competitive intelligence which gathers research on competitors rather than consumers. Brenkert rightly notes that this is a controversial practice with much deception and misrepresentation. He proposes several actions that should be taken to make competitive intelligence more ethical in the future. The final section of the chapter is devoted to market segmentation and target marketing. This is a necessary and often utilized technique which Brenkert supports, although he cautions about targeting based on vulnerability factors such as senility or cognitive immaturity. He emphatically notes that such targeting must not harm consumers or take advantage of their vulnerability.

Chapter 3 represents a good illustration of the author selecting only a few topics within several aspects of marketing and focusing on them. Products, along with their packaging and labeling, pricing and channels of distribution (i.e., place) represent three of the four P's of marketing (promotion being the other). In the Product Development section, Brenkert raises a number of useful ethical questions (e.g., the extent to which these products help address society's problems, p. 92) that marketers should consider. Both safety and environmental impact receive consideration in the product development and packaging sections. The environmental section, while short, does raise a number of considerations that companies must increasingly address in their marketing. The important topics of price deception and price gouging are covered in this chapter as well. One of the strongest sections of the book is Brenkert's discussion of the social aspects of distribution channels where he raises several significant macro-issues including the fact that distributors should consider their societal and cultural impacts (pp. 132-135).

In chapter 4 the author turns his attention to promotion where he examines advertising, retailing and customers. Brenkert correctly notes that promotion is often viewed as the "heart" of marketing activities from outsiders and is frequently criticized because it is the most visible aspect of marketing. His coverage of advertising focuses mostly on truth and deception in advertising and draws attention to what he calls the "cumulative effect" of so much promotion aimed at the marketplace. His discussion of retailing concentrates on gifts and entertainment, slotting fees (paid by manufacturer to retailers), selling and privacy. Truthfulness, honesty and transparency are three values that he believes marketers should follow in these areas. The chapter concludes with a discussion of customer responsibilities. Brenkert notes that customers should not try to defraud or deceive marketers and that they too play a role in developing a more ethical marketing relationship.

The last chapter is titled "Marketing in a Global Society" but only about one-half of the coverage is devoted to international issues. Here Brenkert covers, in depth, important conceptual questions arising from absolutism and relativism. He also examines gifts, bribery and corruption, and controversial products (such as selling products banned in the US elsewhere). Brenkert considers the emerging area of product "sourcing" from an ethical responsibility perspective with respect to both products and employees (even if they work for subcontractors). Recent incidents with Chinese-made products attest to a marketer's need to pay more attention to the sourcing of products. The second topic covered in this chapter is the expansion of marketing to the political and social sectors. Brenkert indicates that many ethical questions arise from this "broadening" of marketing to non-commercial ventures. We only have to turn on the television in an election year to witness ethical issues arising from the extensive adoption of political marketing techniques.

Chapter 5 closes with a discussion of "ethical marketing." (I was pleased to see the emphasis on the positive aspects of marketing in an ethical context because Brenkert, with several co-authors, published a book with ethical marketing as its title three years ago.) Brenkert states that ethical marketing requires: recognition of ethical problems, awareness of relevant concepts and tools, an appreciation that ethical problems go beyond the individual level, and the importance of accountability for one's actions. This four step process is similar to many other ethical decision making models advanced by other authors in the business and marketing ethics field. But his attention to accountability is unique and a needed addition to the process of evaluating the ethical soundness of marketing decisions. Brenkert examines ethical marketing from the individual, organizational, societal and international perspectives. He is rather critical of ethics training that is done online, an approach used by many coompanies. Brenkert also addresses the importance of managerial leadership at both the marketing and the corporate levels. He concludes this discussion with an observation with which this reviewer strongly agrees: "Over recent decades, some progress has been made in fostering ethical marketing, but the threats and obstacles to it are also very real and very significant" (p. 230).

It is difficult to characterize Brenkert's book. It is clearly not aimed at a business executive market. The book's lengthy chapters (forty or more pages each) make it unlikely to be used in marketing ethics classes at the undergraduate or MBA levels. Also, the lack of any graphics (no exhibits but two short appendices) in the book would not attract current-day visually-oriented students. This book would be a good candidate for Ph.D. level seminars in marketing ethics. However, such courses are few and far between. A graduate course in philosophy with an emphasis on professional ethics might find this book helpful. My sense is that the book will be used more as a resource manual than as a class text.

Brenkert was trained in philosophy and is writing about a business topic. Several problems arise because of his lack of familiarity with the marketing field. Most significantly, he treats the selling function as exclusively a retail issue when much of the selling of the high end variety happens at the business-to-business level. Selling is an area fraught with ethical questions and it was surprising not to see more focus on it in the book. The author uses MacIntyre's philosophical notion of "external and internal goods" without distinguishing these from goods in a marketing context which refers to products being offered for sale. Brenkert uses the initials IMC for his integrated marketing concept, but this term is used by marketers to signify Integrated Marketing Communications. His chapter on Promotion includes a discussion of ethical situations in retailing while the standard marketing treatment places retailing issues within the channel of distribution. Similarly, Brenkert notes that the most powerful member of the channel should not necessarily coordinate the interests of the channel. While this is appealing in an ideal world, the concept of the channel "captain" has endured over the years and the leader/captain has shifted in the last decade from the manufacturer to the retailer, partially, but not totally, driven by the influence of Walmart. Finally, two major pieces of legislation have been passed that have made illegal some of the ethical issues noted by the author. The 1996 Telemarketing and Consumer Fraud and Abuse Prevention Act made selling under the guise of research (called sugging) illegal as a deceptive marketing research technique, while the 2000 Children's Online Privacy Protection Act now makes Internet solicitation of children under the age of twelve illegal.

Brenkert's final comments deal with the grounding of the book in prior literature. Because he is a careful and thorough researcher, several omissions are surprising. Reference is made at several points to the importance of communication and dialogue among marketing stakeholders, but the work of Habermas is not cited. Similarly, his discussion of the six central values and norms -- autonomy, freedom, justice, trust, truth and well being -- only make passing mention of the extensive literature in virtue ethics in both philosophy and business ethics. It would have been helpful if Brenkert had clarified how he sees these values as distinct from virtues. In fact, a more extensive definition, discussion and rationale for these central values would have been helpful. For a book published in 2008, it was disconcerting how many of the references were to 1990s editions of books in both marketing and ethics that have undergone revisions since then. For example, the tenth edition of a marketing principles book from the 1990s was heavily referenced while the 14th edition was published in 2007. More substantively, only a small sampling of the rather extensive academic research in marketing ethics published since 2000 is cited. Greater attention to these articles would have helped bolster positions taken throughout the book especially in the areas of advertising, normative perspectives for ethical marketing and relationship marketing.

Despite these weaknesses, Brenkert's book offers a carefully reasoned and serious examination of marketing ethics. He provides useful insights into the several important topics he examines in the text. I hope that other interested scholars will undertake a close inspection of Brenkert's book to see how their own work can be advanced by his ethical analyses. Since the field is still in the growth stage, drawing more attention to the significant ethical problems facing marketers and consumers represents a contribution.