Markets without Limits: Moral Virtues and Commercial Interests

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Jason Brennan and Peter M. Jaworski, Markets without Limits: Moral Virtues and Commercial Interests, Routledge, 2016, 239pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415737357.

Reviewed by Jonathan Anomaly, Duke University/University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill


Philosophers like Michael Sandel and Gerald Cohen have argued that as markets expand into new areas of life, important character virtues wither and valuable social relationships decay.[1]Other philosophers like Debra Satz and Elizabeth Anderson direct their criticism at specific markets ranging from sex and surrogacy to kidneys and votes (though they don't always think moral objections justify legal prohibitions).[2] Giving away morally significant goods and services is fine, even noble, but selling them is wrong. Jason Brennan and Peter M. Jaworski's book is a welcome challenge to this view.

The authors define a market as "the voluntary exchange of goods and services for valuable consideration" (4). Giving a morally neutral and maximally expansive definition like this is useful because it allows us to include barter and cash markets, markets for goods, services, and ideas, as well as markets that are legally permitted, regulated, or prohibited.

The central thesis of the book is that, morally speaking, if you can do something for free, you can do it for money (10). Brennan and Jaworski qualify this claim a bit, but they maintain that in many cases our worries about markets are about the background conditions faced by the parties involved in an exchange (such as unequal bargaining power, or asymmetric information), or about the goods being exchanged (such as sex slaves or hostages, which nobody should be allowed to own). For example, if it's wrong to dump mercury into the municipal water supply or stab a nosy neighbor, it's also wrong for you to get paid to pollute the drinking water or pay a hit man to murder your neighbor. Exchange itself, the authors argue, does not usually raise new moral problems, though it is often mistakenly credited as being the corrupting force behind whatever bad states of affairs we associate with markets (91).

Even if we can show that the consequences of a particular exchange are good, and that the exchange produces no rights violations or uncompensated harms, some critics still worry that introducing money into certain relationships expresses the wrong attitude toward the thing being exchanged, or alters the nature of the relationship. Obvious examples include leaving a tip on the pillow of a romantic partner for a job well done, or paying your grandchildren to visit you on your deathbed. Money seems to introduce crass motivations and substitute self-interest for love as the foundation of relationships.

Brennan and Jaworski call objections like these "semiotic" because they signify how an action can stand for, or symbolize, something good or bad. Wearing a pink bikini or singing a Satanic verse from a Swedish metal band at a funeral might be a bad idea if it signifies insouciance about the recently departed. Even if our grandmother can't rise from the grave to feel disappointment or reprimand us for our aesthetic decisions, we may have wronged her by disrespecting funeral conventions.

Similarly, it might be wrong to sell pink bikinis at our grandmother's funeral not because it violates anyone's rights, or because some people at the service will feel compelled by their emotional vulnerability to buy a bikini. It is wrong in most cases because it signifies disrespect for a solemn occasion. But if Brennan and Jaworski are right, the market for pink bikinis is not intrinsically wrong, and offering them for cash rather than giving them away for free introduces no new wrongness into the situation. What is wrong in this example is to flout culturally-specific norms that signify respect. Part of the reason Brennan and Jaworski think market exchange doesn't necessarily add anything new to the universe of moral problems is that the symbolic meaning of a particular kind of exchange is a socially constructed fact that is subject to change.

It is here that the authors make an original move. On Brennan and Jaworski's view, while it is polite to defer to the socially constructed meaning our culture attaches to a particular action, reasons to be polite are not especially strong when other important values are at stake (82). We should ultimately decide to follow or flout symbolically significant norms only if the expected consequences of doing so are good: "our view is that when there is a clash between semiotics and consequences, consequences win" (62).

There can be real costs -- individual and social -- to conforming to the semiotics that emerge in a culture. If a legal market in human organs offers us tremendous gains, it is not sufficient for us to conclude that because many people in our culture regard this as a way of disrespecting the living, we should respect the norm, let alone codify it as law. Instead, Brennan and Jaworski think we should rebel against a legal system that bans organ sales as a way of symbolically protecting the dignity of life when a predictable consequence of the prohibition is the premature death of many people (70).

Of course, many worry about organ sellers being disproportionately vulnerable people who either don't understand the consequences of selling their organs, or who consider this the best among a bad set of options determined by unjust background conditions. Others worry that if we opened up a market for organs, poor people would more often sell than buy organs, and that the distributive consequences of the market would be unjust. Replies to these objections have existed for a long time in the literature[3], and they include measures like the state letting people sell their organs only after they receive medical and psychiatric counsel, and subsidizing people who qualify for organs but can't afford to buy them.

Brennan and Jaworski argue early on that "The question of whether it is morally permissible to have a market in some good or service is not the same as the question of whether it's permissible to have a free, completely unregulated market in that good or service" (25). They consider it reasonable to regulate a market if doing so can be shown to protect third parties, prevent unjust exploitation, or lead to better distributive consequences. But as we've seen, some critics of markets suggest that even if these worries can be assuaged through regulation, some markets are wrong because of the signals they send.

Brennan and Jaworski agree that actions have symbolic power, but they want us to ask the economists' question: what are the opportunity costs, or benefits foregone, of maintaining our semiotic codes? And when should we attempt to modify these codes?

When the semiotics that pervade your culture are socially harmful, Brennan and Jaworski assert that "you may conscientiously choose to reject the code of meaning" (72). It is easy to agree that we may be morally justified in rejecting a culture's semiotics. But Brennan and Jaworski arguably don't go far enough by offering us moral permissions rather than requirements.

It is plausible that we have an obligation to exert significant effort to change socially harmful semiotic conventions, even at great personal cost, when we have the power to do so. Influential academics like Satz and Sandel, or Brennan and Jaworski, can be thought of as norm entrepreneurs with special obligations to defend or criticize the prevailing semiotics with novel arguments.[4] But academics are not alone in having strong obligations to evaluate and potentially change the norms that determine the symbolic meaning of particular actions or exchanges. Anyone who is well-placed to assess the expected consequences of rival norms, and who can influence people to adopt superior norms, seems to have reasons to try to overturn existing norms when the personal risks are small.

If this is right, perhaps we have obligations to contribute to norm change in proportion to some combination of our ability to do so, our evidence that a better norm is on offer, and the strength of our reasons to believe that a particular norm among the socially feasible set will produce better consequences than the available alternatives.

In the final part of the book, Brennan and Jaworski consider the possibility that some opposition to markets is rooted in visceral but morally unjustifiable feelings like disgust. Indeed, critics sometimes use words like "disgusting," "repugnant," or "repulsive" rather than "unfair" or "socially harmful" to describe markets they worry about (197). Some use these terms to describe the consequences of black markets, but often this language reflects gut reactions to legally sanctioned markets like the sale of cadavers or body parts from aborted fetuses.

Sometimes our gut reactions are reliable indicators that there is something morally wrong going on, but psychologists have illustrated the many ways in which people tend to develop post-hoc rationalizations for their feelings of disgust. In one study, Jonathan Haidt recorded the reactions of subjects to a hypothetical case of an adult brother and sister who decide to have consensual sex during a vacation in France. They use birth control, and keep their affair secret in order to avoid offending their parents. Researchers reassured subjects that the decision was not made under duress and that the liaison would not produce children. Yet many subjects continued to maintain that the relationship was wrong for reasons they couldn't specify.[5] Social psychologists call this phenomenon "moral dumbfounding," and Brennan and Jaworski use this concept to explain at least some of the intractable intuitions people have about the wrongness of markets that strike us as objectionable for reasons we can't quite articulate (207).

Our moral intuitions evolved, in part, to solve collective action problems in small-scale societies.[6] So they are often unreliable guides to how we should organize large-scale political institutions, or react to how people raised in very different communities choose to live their lives. This suggests that we should be careful to avoid elevating a moral intuition or a value-laden gut reaction to the status of an enforceable law unless we can show that doing so prevents harm to others, improves social welfare, protects autonomy, or promotes other widely shared values that can survive scrutiny. Aversion to incest and homosexuality almost certainly helped our ancestors maximize inclusive fitness, even if these aversions fail to promote human welfare, especially in the modern world. Evolution has never "aimed at" making creatures happy, but at least some of the moral intuitions that gave our ancestors reproductive advantages in the past cause tremendous misery in the present, especially when we unreflectively use these intuitions to ground social norms or legal sanctions.[7]

Some critics of markets that elicit repugnance would argue that we just haven't yet found a justification for these attitudes,[8] while Brennan and Jaworski would likely say this is because a justification is not forthcoming. Both sides are making an inference to the best explanation, but I suspect Brennan and Jaworski are right.

It's worth exploring some parallels between inferences we might make in ethics with those in the sciences. Long before the advent of genetics, Charles Darwin knew that for evolution by natural selection to work, there had to be some mechanism (what we now know to be DNA) for faithfully transmitting information to create body parts and repair tissues (from what we now know to be proteins). The best explanation was that something was there doing the work, although Darwin didn't quite know what.

Similarly, cosmologists have noticed that the universe is expanding at a rate that exceeds what gravity alone can account for. Many cosmologists assume the best explanation for the universe's accelerating rate of expansion is something they call "dark energy" (dark energy differs from dark matter, but has a similar placeholder status as an unknown feature of the universe that is supposed to help explain well-understood phenomena).

Are the gut reactions we feel when we encounter a market that makes us queasy an indicator that our queasiness is justified, for reasons we don't yet understand? Maybe so, but I doubt it. In high stakes cases like markets for organs or genetically engineered babies, we should take our cue from Brennan and Jaworski and look to the expected consequences of markets -- including regulated markets -- on human welfare as a way of gauging whether our gut reactions are a reliable indicator of whether a market is morally justified.

[1] Michael Sandel, What Money Can't Buy: The Moral Limits of Markets, Farrar, Straus and Giroux, 2013. Gerald Cohen, Why not Socialism? Princeton University Press, 2009.

[2] Debra Satz, Why Some Things Should not be for Sale. Oxford University Press, 2012. Elizabeth Anderson, Value in Ethics and Economics, Harvard University Press, 1995.

[3] See Gerald Dworkin, "Markets and Morals: The Case for Organ Sales." Reprinted in Philosophy, Politics, and Economics, Oxford University Press, 2015.

[4] According to Robert Ellickson, a "norm entrepreneur" is someone in a social group with "superior technical intelligence, social intelligence, and leadership skills." "The Market for Social Norms." American Law and Economics Review 3(1), 2001.

[5] The Righteous Mind, Vintage Publishing, 2013, p. 45.

[6] Herbert Gintis and Samuel Bowles, A Cooperative Species: Human Reciprocity and Its Evolution. Princeton University Press, 2013.

[7] Allen Buchanan and Russell Powell, "Toward a Naturalistic Theory of Moral Progress." Social Philosophy and Policy (forthcoming). Jonny Anomaly and Geoffrey Brennan, "Social Norms, The Invisible Hand, and the Law." University of Queensland Law Journal, 33(2), 2014.

[8] Leon Kass, "The Wisdom of Repugnance." The New Republic, June 2, 1997.