Martin Heidegger: Key Concepts

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Bret W. Davis (ed.), Martin Heidegger: Key Concepts, Acumen, 2010, 288pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844651993.

Reviewed by Lee Braver, Hiram College



How does one make Heidegger accessible? Explaining philosophers to non-experts is often a tricky business, courting the perils of either dissipating the ideas in trite slogans or merely circulating jargon-like secret passwords known only to the initiated. But with Heidegger, the passage between these dangers is particularly treacherous, as Bret W. Davis acknowledges on the first page of Martin Heidegger: Key Concepts. His solution is to select a number of important ideas that range across great swaths of Heidegger’s work, and have prominent scholars “clearly and concisely articulate … their understanding of the key concepts of their particular areas of expertise” (xi). Each discussion guides readers through a specific topic; combined in a roughly chronological order, they offer an overview of his oeuvre. The essays are fairly short (usually 10-12 pages) and are broken into bite-size portions, allowing readers to find quick clarifications of particular subjects. Moreover, the editor has inserted references to the relevant chapter when its topic appears in a different essay, enabling the reader to follow up on ideas that catch their attention. Many of the chapters interweave nicely, combining for a total greater than the sum of the parts.

Davis’ goal is to present essays valuable both to those first approaching Heidegger and to those who know his work well. Obviously, “this daunting balancing act” (xi) is difficult to achieve since these aims tend to pull in opposite directions. The more an article succeeds in giving a general introduction to a topic, the less it usually offers to those conversant with the subject. Conversely, the more an article aims at expanding the knowledge of experts, the more likely it is to leave the uninitiated behind. Davis admits that many of the essays emphasize the one aim at the expense of the other (xii), and it would be difficult to reach any other conclusion. However, most do accomplish one of the goals — no small achievement in itself — and some succeed in pleasing both audiences by following a single thread throughout Heidegger’s various texts and periods, orienting new readers while simultaneously providing the experienced with a helpful overview of the development of a topic. In general, I think that it would have been more beneficial for new readers had the authors covered less ground but with more detailed elucidation. The individual entries, as with most collections, vary in quality and in how they negotiate the trade-off between accessible elucidation and esoteric disquisition. It is to these that I now turn.

Davis opens the book with a very brief biographical sketch that only partially fulfills his promise of being written for "compellingly Heideggerian reasons" (2), and which does not actually show how the events of Heidegger’s life affect his thinking. Davis then gives a short discussion of Heidegger’s central, constant concern: the question of being. He correctly points out that Heidegger came to adopt a three-part ontology consisting of beings, their beingness (or the being of beings), and being itself. Respectively, these are individual entities, the metaphysical definition of what it means to be (e.g., existing meant being a divine creation in the Middle Ages, or a substance in early modern epoch), and the basic fact that entities appear to us at all. Davis finishes the introduction by briefly covering a few features of being that are certainly important, but all of which get their own essay in the collection, making this quick examination rather superfluous. He also contributes a rather odd final chapter made up of passages, primarily from Heidegger’s writings, concerning Christianity and divinity. Davis selected and organized this list of quotations which can certainly aid research, but he chose simply to present them instead of doing the kind of expository work that I thought this book was supposed to offer.

Drawing on his vast knowledge, Theodore Kisiel traces the hermeneutics of facticity from earlier philosophers through Heidegger’s work up to 1930. His discussion of the way phenomenology relates to this topic and to authenticity is particularly good, although he skirts an issue I have always found problematic. Heidegger’s early approach to traditional philosophical ideas is to dismantle them in order to gain access to “the original experiences from which they have developed” (24). As Husserl argued in “The Origin of Geometry”, we need to dig up Plato and Aristotle’s vivacious experiences before they became mummified in terminology. This phenomenological project seems incompatible with the hermeneutic idea that one always interprets “in accord with the unique temporal context in which each individual is situated” (30). Hermeneutic situatedness ruins a 20th century German professor’s attempt to have the same experiences as Aristotle. I certainly cannot demand that essays answer my questions, but the conflict appears within Kisiel’s exposition and I would have liked to hear his take on it. While not terribly difficult, the essay does not seem designed to introduce these concepts to novices.

Charles E. Scott approaches care and authenticity by taking the myth of care in Being and Time seriously, wringing philosophical insights from this passage which often strikes readers, including myself, as rather hokey. His paper covers virtually all of Being and Time — an impressive feat — although discussing fewer ideas in greater depth might have been more helpful to the beginner. The paper ends with the intriguing suggestion that authenticity could form the basis for an ethics and political philosophy, but a full treatment of this deserves its own article. Charles Bambach investigates the "philosophical meaning" of Heidegger’s involvement with National Socialism (102), showing how his views might have primed him for this terrible alliance, and how its failure reverberates in his later thought. Bambach presents a fair account, dispensing blame and absolution where merited.

Jonathan Dronsfield takes on the work of art, covering the entire “The Origin of the Work of Art” in eight pages, which inevitably leaves some important ideas less than fully explained. Personally, I would have liked a fuller exposition of the rift, a topic I have always found elusive. He discusses how Heidegger’s views apply to abstract art well (133), although this does raise the specter of Heidegger’s worries about representation. Dronsfield also makes the claim that an artwork’s opening of a world “happens once only, in the ‘original’ siting of the work” (131). It’s certainly true that a work’s ability to open a world can end (similar to the discussion of historical equipment at Being and Time 431-2/380), but the claim that it only happens once appears to contradict the role of later “preservers”, a topic Dronsfield discusses (135). Daniela Vallega-Neu focuses on Ereignis, helpfully distinguishing three senses of the term (145-6) and how it changes between the “middle” and “late” Heidegger. This essay seems more appropriate for Heidegger scholars than first-time readers.

Peter Warnek delves into the history of being, admirably explaining that the epochs cover over what is essential. He expounds Heidegger’s claim that the history of metaphysics has exhausted all possible variations (164-5), but without addressing the way this rather Hegelian idea presupposes a determinate set of understandings of being, which seems incompatible with Heidegger’s frequent attempts to free this sequence from any kind of logic or necessity. Unlike most of the contributors, John T. Lysaker examines the way Heidegger’s writings phenomenologically point us to experiences of language rather than tracing the development of this topic idea throughout his career (195). He focuses on the claim that language speaks, that is, that we always already find ourselves within language in a way that is not up to us. Neither our linguistic nature nor particular word choices are within our control; rather, we respond to things’ solicitations and words’ meanings, something poets do especially well. This “anti-humanism” is essential to the later work.

Andrew J. Mitchel faces the daunting task of making sense of the fourfold, perhaps the most obscure idea in all of Heidegger’s work. He makes the rather surprising claim that Heidegger’s discussions of this topic represent “his most phenomenological thought” (209), although the way this occurs remains implicit in the essay. Mitchel opens with a good explanation of the way Heidegger’s ontology expanded beyond Being and Time‘s three ways of being in the direction of further “desubstantializ[ing]” things (209), that is, making them holistically interdependent on other things and their environment instead of self-sufficient substances. He gives an excellent treatment of mortality, showing how it both extends and alters Heidegger’s early views on death. However, his account of the next three parts of the fourfold did not clarify matters for me. My failure to understand may be entirely my fault — I have never really grasped the fourfold — but my difficulty may be representative of reader’s reactions. Mitchel ends with the intriguing suggestion that we should read Heidegger’s talks in the context in which they were given, though he does not do this here.

Ben Vedder argues that we must examine Heidegger’s views on ontotheology and gods in the context of his early experiences with religion (219), though I’m not sure how much these biographical details actually inform his account. Vedder traces the changing relationship between philosophy and religion across Heidegger’s works, as well as how particular religious notions (such as kairos) inform certain writings. These explanations are helpful, although the distinctions he draws among the holy, god, godhead, and divinities frankly lost me (229). I was rather surprised that Kierkegaard makes no appearance. Authors must leave out a great deal to write such brief accounts, of course, but no one has thought more about religion as a matter of one’s facticity than Kierkegaard, whose influence on Being and Time Heidegger acknowledges.

I must confess that I found Günter Figal’s discussion of Heidegger’s take on phenomenology, especially insofar as it relates to the Greeks, quite thorny. This is not helped by phrases like, “this ontologization of phenomenology — and phenomenologization of ontology” (36), which contrast with the way most of the authors strive to write accessibly. Figal attributes the importance of phenomenology to our historical position as heirs to Greek thinkers who wielded this method avant la lettre. But he also calls it “nothing but the very possibility of thinking… . It is the unnamed — and thus usually also the unknown — in all thinking” (33-4). This “anonymization and universalization of phenomenology” (34) makes the historical explanation redundant and possibly misleading. Figal also argues that Heidegger, in thrall to the Greeks, defines being as physis in the sense of beings spontaneously emerging out of concealment which, Figal contends, only applies to natural entities, not to artifacts made by us (38-9). However, the idea of the artifact (formal cause), the suitability of certain materials for it (material cause), and its desirability (final cause) arise spontaneously. The fact that these thoughts “strike us” is Heidegger’s main argument against the idea that we created the essence of technology.

I must say, with great reluctance, that I was disappointed by Thomas Sheehan’s essay on the turn, though this is at least partially due to my high opinion of his work (I have long considered “A Paradigm Shift in Heidegger Research”1 one of the best pieces written on Heidegger). He begins with the interesting and slightly provocative thesis that Heidegger never underwent a turn (82). Once he has distinguished three meanings of the turn, however, this claim turns out to be largely semantic. Sheehan accepts the idea (which he calls Kehre-2) that Heidegger abandoned his early transcendental treatment of Dasein to focus on being’s claim upon us (89-91, 98n. 14), precisely the change that most scholars mean when they speak of the Kehre. Sheehan’s point is that Kehre-1 — the mutual reciprocity between Dasein/man and being — remains Heidegger’s central topic throughout his career (92). This is true and helpful, but I found that framing it in terms of the meanings of terms obfuscated rather than clarified it. Little accommodation is made for those new to the topic, with German and Greek phrases liberally sprinkled throughout. At one point he instructs those readers “uncomfortable with the translation” to substitute “the traditional Heideggerian code words”, assuming more familiarity on the reader’s part than appropriate given the intent of this collection (84). Whereas Sheehan’s prose is pellucid elsewhere, here we find sentences like, "the genitive in such phrases as Wesen/Lichtung/Wahrheit/Da des Seins indicates a pleonasm: Sein selbst is its Wesen/Lichtung/Wahrheit/Da" (84). The point he’s trying to get across is important and difficult to state, and he gives a brief gloss in the next sentence, but I don’t think the exposition is helped by phrases like this. Again, I have the highest regard for Sheehan’s work; I just did not find this piece to be up to his usual standards. The essay does contain a good discussion of the danger of anthropomorphizing being (93-4) and of technology (95-7).

Happily, I can praise several articles for successfully navigating the dangers inherent in expository writing. Davis himself contributes a wonderful piece on will and Gelassenheit. He guides the reader with a light but sure touch through Heidegger’s development from early ambivalence on the topic, to outright voluntarism in the early 1930’s, only to emerge from his catastrophic involvement with National Socialism and long engagement with Nietzsche to find our age disastrously defined by will. He also lays out the paradox inherent in attempts to effect Gelassenheit very clearly.

Richard Polt opens his discussion of the relationship between being and time with an instructive contrast with Plotinus, standing in for the long line of philosophers who consider the two mutually exclusive. To paraphrase Epicurus, where temporal change is, true being is not; where true being is, there time cannot be. Heidegger’s point is that even when metaphysicians denounce time as merely an indication of unreality, they are still using it to understand reality; in Heidegger’s terms, time forms the horizon for understanding Being. Polt does a very good job of showing how temporality unifies Being and Time, and then traces its evolution into Ereignis in the 1930’s and giving ("Es gibt“) in the late work. This piece strikes a friendly, informal tone well-suited to students.

”NDPRBodyTexT">Daniel O. Dahlstrom unpacks Heidegger’s understanding of truth, helpfully identifying the master three-step argument — from correspondence to unhiddenness to the clearing, where each step presupposes the next — that repeatedly crops up in his work (116-7). Dahlstrom offers a particularly illuminating explanation of the clearing, and a masterful, compressed analysis of the changes between Being and Time and the works of the mid 1930’s, tucked away in an endnote (126n. 5). I have quibbles with a couple of Dahlstrom’s claims — he appears to equate the hiddenness-unhiddenness pairing with the earth-world strife of “The Origin of the Work of Art” (117) although Heidegger cautions against this identification2; he says that the open realm between unconcealed entities and man first appears in 1937-8 lectures (119), whereas I find it in 1930’s “On the Essence of Truth” (ibid. 121) — but these are minor concerns. It’s a very good essay that can benefit students greatly.

Timothy Stapleton explains being-in-the-world with forceful sentences, defining all technical terms and illuminating the ideas with helpful examples (47). He shows a real knack for explaining tough ideas. Hans Ruin’s account of technology starts by walking the reader through Aristotle’s account of technē and the way Being and Time departs from Heidegger’s earlier views. Ruin then shows how and, more importantly, why Heidegger abandoned both positions to develop an entirely new idea, partially inspired by the way artworks escape Being and Time‘s categories. He claims that Heidegger’s later work can be read in terms of divergent meanings of technology (188), and then delivers on this promise in an account that does perhaps the best job in the book of squeezing new insights from well-travelled paths. These authors demonstrate superb skill in explaining difficult ideas in ways that are accessible to those approaching them for the first time, and valuable to those familiar with the subject matter. One can only hope for more work like this.

1 Continental Philosophy Review, 34 (2001), 183-202.

2 Basic Writings, Revised ed. Ed. David Farrell Krell. San Francisco: HarperSanFrancisco, 1993, p. 180.