Marvelous Images: On Values and the Arts

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Kendall L. Walton, Marvelous Images: On Values and the Arts, Oxford University Press, 2008, 254pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195177954.

Reviewed by Scott Walden, Nassau Community College


My favorite art exhibitions are those devoted to artists whom I greatly admire and that make apparent just when and in what form their particular brilliance emerged. Winogrand 1964 showed the photographer leaving behind a static style of composition and developing the dynamic one for which he became famous. Diane Arbus Revelations made apparent her abandonment of a voyeuristic relationship with her photographic subjects in favor of the direct eye-contact for which she is now celebrated.

Kendall Walton's Marvelous Images: On Values and the Arts, is a philosophy-world analogue of such exhibitions. This collection of fourteen essays and postscripts, ranging in dates from 1972 to the present, shows a philosopher transforming both in terms of his methodology and his relationship to his subject matter. Whereas the earliest essays advance largely via conceptual analysis and react to issues that were in the air at the time of their writing, the later essays are propelled by a sophisticated form of theory construction and help set the current agenda for research in aesthetics.

The two earliest essays -- "Categories of Art" and "Style and the Products and Processes of Art" -- emerged in the context of debates about the intentional fallacy and, more generally, about the relevance of contextual matters in the evaluation of artworks. Walton's analysis of various aesthetic properties suggests that their supervenience bases (as we say today) extend well beyond the physical boundaries of artworks to include the artists' intentions, the actual or apparent processes that led to the formation of the works, the character of other contemporary or historical works, and the various categories recognized by the artistic community as a whole. Such "wide" supervenience of artworks is today so generally accepted that one might worry that these essays are of historical interest only. But I found matters otherwise. An admirable pluralism has overtaken curatorial sensibilities during the past decade or two, and Walton's analysis, with its emphasis on evaluation relative to "categories of art," might help us to understand how value can be found in works as widely divergent as Pollock and Warhol canvases, Weston and Sherman photographs, or Schoenberg and Reich compositions.

With one or perhaps two exceptions, all later essays must be understood against the backdrop of Walton's landmark book Mimesis as Make-Believe (Harvard University Press, 1991), and thus the collection is in no way a replacement for this work (although "Pictures and Hobby Horses" is a highly accessible presentation of its central idea). The book takes as its starting point various data concerning our engagement with examples from the visual and literary arts, and postulates an array of psychological states in order to account for these. These data include intuitions about the depictive or narrative content of various artworks, and the postulated psychological states include most centrally a cluster of closely related kinds of propositional attitude collected under the rubric imagining. Subtleties abound as Walton considers nuances of depictive and literary content, and augments his postulated psychology to distinguish between, for example, imagining that p and entertaining that p, or between imagining p and imagining that p.

As thoroughgoing as Walton's presentation in Mimesis is, it is possible to want more. A specification of propositional contents as detailed as is the norm in the literature on the semantics of belief ascription would, for example, be helpful, as would a more-detailed discussion of the interplay between propositional contents and the phenomenal aspects of mentation. But the essays in this collection are not intended to function in this way. Instead, their purpose is to highlight the explanatory advantages of Walton's theory relative to its competitors, and to broaden its range of application to phenomena in value theory and -- intriguingly -- photography (a forthcoming companion volume promises treatment of empathy and ontology, especially in connection with fiction and music).

The reprint "Morals in Fiction" and the new "On (So-Called) Imaginative Resistance" account for one type of aesthetic failure in terms of difficulties we manifest in imagining certain things. On Walton's theory, something is fictional in a work if we are enjoined to imagine it. However, there is a range of propositions -- absurdities such as that nutmeg is the summum bonum, for example, or morally repugnant ideas such as that female infanticide is proper -- that we are unable or unwilling to imagine. Perhaps some works of literature fail because they mandate that we imagine such things. Also, Walton wonders, why is it that we are unable to imagine certain odd states of affairs but not others? We easily imagine frogs turning into princes, but balk at the supremacy of nutmeg. Perhaps it is because in those cases in which imagination fails us the architecture of our minds does not enable us to imagine the changes in supervenience relations that would be required in order to accommodate such odd occurrences. And why do we resist imagining moral codes that conflict dramatically with our own? Perhaps it is because there is danger in doing so, as continued such practice might cause our accepted moral code to change in detrimental ways.

There was a push in the 1970s away from the traditional view that photographic images stand importantly apart from images generally. Walton's classic essay "Transparent Pictures," reprinted here, tamped down firmly on this, characterizing a respect in which the mentation of the image-maker is excluded during the formation of a photographic image, but included during the formation of a handmade image such as a painting or a drawing. Furthermore, he argued that such exclusion enables viewers of photographic images to have special perceptual contact with the persons and objects that were in front of the camera at the moment of exposure, a form of contact that is of the same natural kind as that afforded by mirrors, microscopes, and telescopes. And he suggested that such perceptual contact overlaps sufficiently with our ordinary-language-based concept seeing to justify saying that we see through photographs; they are transparent pictures.

Critics quickly jumped on this transparency suggestion, analyzing 'seeing' as it is used in conversation, and highlighting respects in which perceptual contact via photographs fails to satisfy alleged necessary conditions for its application. But in a postscript to "Transparent Pictures," newly written for this collection, Walton warns against this understanding of his original rhetorical strategy. By the time he wrote "Transparent Pictures" in 1981, he had largely left behind the methodology of conceptual analysis and replaced it with that of theory construction. In that paper he took as his starting point facts such as that we cherish photographs of departed loved ones and explained them by postulating a special kind of perceptual contact, a kind afforded by images that exclude mentation from their formative processes. Whether or not such perceptual contact overlaps well with our ordinary-language-based concept seeing was of little interest to him, as he was by then in the business of explaining phenomena by discovering natural kinds, kinds which remain important regardless of their relationships with our day-to-day conceptual scheme.

I agree that ordinary-language analysis is not the most fruitful approach to this topic, and I applaud Walton's later methodology. Furthermore, I think Walton is exactly right that there is an important respect in which mentation is frequently excluded from the typical formative processes of photographic images. And his most general point -- that there is something special about photographic images that often sets them apart from images generally -- is correct and important. If I have an objection to Walton's program in "Transparent Pictures" and its postscript, it is to his explanation of photographic phenomena in terms of special perceptual contact rather than in terms of the various epistemic advantages afforded by the medium. Elsewhere I have argued that the exclusion of mentation from the photographic process enhances the epistemic value of photographs by enhancing the warrant viewers have for beliefs they form as a result of looking at photographs ("Objectivity in Photography," British Journal of Aesthetics, 45:3 [2005]). Assuming for present purposes that my argument is sound, I think we can go further and explain in terms of such warrant many of the photographic phenomena Walton thinks we need to postulate special perceptual contact in order to explain. Here is not the place for an extended argument in this direction, but I will consider one class of photographic phenomena that has been discussed in the literature, indicating how the epistemic-advantage approach might at least be on par with Walton's perceptual-contact approach, and, indeed, why it might in fact be preferable to it.

Susan Sontag once asked us to imagine the celebration that would ensue if we were to discover a photograph of Shakespeare. Let me alter the example so that it is somewhat less historically implausible. Suppose that Beethoven had secretly sat for Niépce and that the resultant photograph were today discovered and circulated. We would examine it with rapt attention, even if it were of the same low resolution as the famous image taken from Niépce's workshop window. Such attention would be a psychological-sociological fact in want of explanation. Walton's theory provides it: unlike the various handmade portraits we have of Beethoven, the photographic image would offer special perceptual contact with the great composer, and we value such contact. This, on Walton's view, is why we would be so fascinated with the photograph.

But this phenomenon might also be explained in terms of the epistemic advantage I suggest photographs offer. Consider that we are naturally curious about what Beethoven looked like. We wonder, for example, whether his hair was in fact disheveled, or whether he in fact scowled. The handmade portraits of Beethoven suggest answers to these questions, but in viewing them we worry that the appearances they offer have been inflected by, say, the romantic-era sensibilities of the painters. The photograph, by way of contrast, with mentation excluded from its formative process, might likewise enable us to form beliefs about such matters, but if it did the warrant attending them would be substantial. Since it is belief attended by substantial warrant that satisfies our curiosity, this would account for our fascination with the photograph.

Walton might object, pointing out that the imagined fuzzy, black-and-white photograph would offer little information in comparison with the detailed, full-color handmade portraits we have of Beethoven, and asking how it could be that it is the informativeness of the photograph that we value when it is apparently so much less informative than the paintings. But, if he objected in this way, Walton would be overlooking the fact that there are at least two dimensions to informativeness, the first having to do with the number of facts about which an image enables us to form beliefs, and the second having to do with the warrant the image provides for any beliefs so-formed. It might be correct that the photograph would enable us to form beliefs about only a few facts, whereas the handmade portraits enable us to form beliefs about many, but the former beliefs would be attended by substantially greater warrant. Perhaps in our epistemic scheme of value having one or two highly warranted beliefs trumps having a host of suspect beliefs.

Assuming that both the perceptual-contact and the epistemic-advantage theories explain the photographic phenomenon to which Sontag drew our attention, is there some reason available for preferring one theory to the other? To my mind the perceptual-contact explanation is ad hoc. Walton, confronted with various real and interesting photographic phenomena, postulates a special kind of perceptual contact, a kind that explains quickly and easily just those phenomena. No more is said about the character of this special kind of perceptual contact (beyond that it supervenes on causal processes that exclude mentation), and it stands largely apart from other well-understood bodies of knowledge. The epistemic-advantage approach, by way of contrast, asks us to postulate no new natural kinds, perceptual or otherwise. Instead it accounts for photographic phenomena in very familiar and well-established epistemological terms. Additionally, it offers the possibility of a smooth continuum with cases about which all parties agree: that there are many contexts -- evidentiary and photojournalistic ones, for example -- in which we obviously value photographs for the epistemic advantages they offer.

Admittedly, there are other kinds of photographic phenomena that at least prima facie work in Walton's favor. It would, for example, be comical were I to attempt to account for our tendency to treasure photographs of departed loved ones in terms of the epistemic advantages those photographs offer (as though I keep this snapshot of my mother here at my desk because it enables me to form warranted beliefs about, say, the color of her hair). But I believe there is a way of accounting for such phenomena that involves neither the epistemic-advantage nor the perceptual-contact approach, and, if this is correct, this class of examples would be neutral between these competing theories. I reserve a discussion of this for another occasion.

If "Transparent Pictures" was written after Walton had developed his mature methodology, it is less apparent that the program embodied in Mimesis had fully formed in his mind at the time of its writing. The reprint "On Pictures and Photographs" and the new "Experiencing Still Photographs" remedy this by offering a detailed examination of the interaction between the perceptual natural kind highlighted in "Transparent Pictures" and the array of psychological natural kinds postulated as part of the Mimesis program. Whereas the former essay is largely clarificatory insofar as it addresses some misinterpretations of the application of the Mimesis program to film theory, the latter is groundbreaking in that it opens up the topic of the differing aesthetics of still and motion-picture photography. According to Walton's program, viewers of all photographically produced images -- still or motion-picture -- are not only in special perceptual contact with the subjects of the images, they as well simultaneously imagine that their experiences of looking at the images are direct perceptions of those subjects. Questions thus arise about the temporal contents of the various psychological states engendered. When looking at a still photograph is the viewer in special perceptual contact with the subject for an instant of its existence or for a duration of its existence? Does this duration coincide with or differ from the duration of the imagined perception? And how about in cases of motion pictures -- do the actual and imagined perceptual contacts coincide or differ in temporal durations, and in what respects do they coincide with or differ from those engendered by looking at still photographs?

"How Marvelous!" is unique in that it was first published after Mimesis, and yet does not rely on the framework presented in that work. But Walton's mature methodology is nonetheless in evidence. He develops a notion of value in part in terms of a variety of postulated psychological states, and then invites his readers to consider whether or not this developed notion of value overlaps sufficiently with the notion of aesthetic value found in the literature over the years to count as an "analysis" of it.

The collection will thus find an audience among those interested in value theory. Additionally, for those interested in the philosophy of photography, the postscript to "Transparent Pictures" alone is worth the price of the book, and as a bonus "Experiencing Still Photographs" is a good bet for those wanting to get in on the ground floor of what is likely to become a hot topic. The distinctions in the essays on imaginative resistance will reinvigorate that literature, and two essays on Richard Wollheim's work (one new for this collection) will challenge those who prefer the famous seeing-in theory to the imagination-based one offered by Mimesis. More generally, however, this collection, together with Mimesis (and, I expect, the forthcoming companion volume), will constitute a "must have" trio, not only for connoisseurs of Walton's philosophy, but as well for those of us who are fascinated by the dynamics exhibited by the careers of people who are the very best at what they do.