Marx and Whitehead: Process, Dialectics, and the Critique of Capitalism

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Pomeroy, Anne Fairchild, Marx and Whitehead: Process, Dialectics, and the Critique of Capitalism, SUNY Press, 2004, 231pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0791459837.

Reviewed by Jeanne Schuler, Creighton University


Marx's texts are among the most demanding in modern thought, though they are often short-changed by scholars and sidelined in the curriculum. Marx's contributions are typically summed up in wooden ways that do not open up a line of thinking or research. Consequently, their impact on the practice of philosophy and the social sciences is negligible. Why study Marx? The vocabulary is not remarkable. But adequately reading the texts takes us beyond the familiar modes of analysis to a largely unknown mode of thinking. Few readers come prepared for the task. Marx's debt to Hegel is acknowledged without grasping the pervasive difference in how Marx understands knowledge and the modern world. His use of categories and understanding of reality are not comparable to his contemporaries; they are closer to Aristotle than to Kant. Marx is not a skeptic in the mold of modern thinkers who first separate thought from objectivity and then struggle to draw them together. Marx's skepticism is directed at capitalism, not at truth or the possibility of human understanding. With Marx, form is not contrasted with content--as the subjective isolated from the objective--but social form describes the specific purposes that characterize society in pervasive ways. How do we appreciate a thinker who is not bedeviled by the usual doubts and conundrums that hog-tie modern thought?

First, consider the obstacles to reading Marx. The standpoint of conceptual polarity often frames debates about Marx. Is Marx an idealist inspired by justice or a materialist who dismisses norms in favor of empirical science? If Marx is a materialist, can he account for a critical theory, such as his own? Are humans free to revolt or determined by burdensome social conditions? If the present is shaped by the past, how will non-capitalist social forms emerge from capitalist society? How can negation arise within a totalizing form of society? A major roadblock concerns the legend of the "two Marxes": the young humanistic critic of capitalism and the older systematic theorist of capitalism. Supposedly, the moral passion of the young thinker disappears into the scientific mindedness of the author of Capital. The later critique then fails to appreciate the human agency and political life that generate social change. Norms disappear as the intricate system of categories unfolds. Marx delivers a theory but no longer clearly addresses exactly what is unjust about capitalism or even how we could address this question. Is labor the problem or does labor hold the key to human liberation? Lurking behind the present neglect of Marx is the suspicion that these texts primarily focus on communism and are thus refuted by history, since communism is thoroughly discredited. As we see, the path to engaging Marx's texts is obstructed from numerous directions.

Anne Pomeroy tackles these obstacles boldly by turning to Whitehead's metaphysics in order to open up Marx's critique of capitalism. Her proposal is striking on several grounds. Whitehead is not fabled for accessibility; how can the arcane ideas of process philosophy shed light on Marx's texts? Furthermore, Whitehead was not shaped by an encounter with Marx's texts, and he pled ignorance concerning Hegel's legacy. One thinker focuses on historically specific social forms; the other identifies the encompassing dimensions of all reality. How can such disparate projects be fruitfully joined?

Pomeroy reconceives the disparity between social critique and metaphysics as a source of illumination, "a clash of doctrines . . is an opportunity" (3). Marx and Whitehead are only apparently at cross-purposes; actually both are "deeply innovative" in kindred ways. With such notions as misplaced concreteness and dialectic, Whitehead can clarify Marx's meanings. Confusion concerning Marx's theory sets in when abstractions necessary for analysis are mistaken for the concrete or the phenomenon. With the help of process thought, readers of Marx can pay better attention to the "degrees of abstraction" or "levels of specificity" that make up a critique, thereby distinguishing the general abstractions that are applicable to every society (such as use values) from the abstractions specific to capitalism (exchange value).

The affinity between Marx and Whitehead that Pomeroy recognizes exists on several levels: both thinkers situate ideas in experience and history as fallible generalizations. Both begin with experience and return to it; both identify the false dichotomies and abstractions that mystify thought; both develop concepts that could be described as dialectical. Both are said to rely upon internal relations in their analyses: Marx at the level of "macrocosmic empirical analysis of social production" (69) and Whitehead at the microcosmic or metaphysical level of actual entities. Marx's category of production is the functional equivalent of process in Whitehead's thought. Both process and production share these features: "Productive ability as the driving force behind world process (creativity), creative dependence on the given as its source and product (actuality), and thus deep interdependence of all elements of reality on all others as mutually constituting (being as fully relational)" (61). Persons--like the actual entities of metaphysics--transform the given data in producing their world as new (66). With the notion of internal relations--appropriated from Leibniz by Whitehead--Pomeroy endeavors to dissolve intractable standoffs, such as freedom/determinism, physical/conceptual, one/many, or possibility/necessity, by showing how both dimensions constitute each entity. Being determined by the past does not exclude the emergence of possibilities in the present. Creativity is fundamental to the emergence of things from prior conditions. What ordinary habits of thought separate, process thought discloses as inseparable. The basic ideas of Whitehead, in Pomeroy's hands, allow us to get past the sterile readings of Marx and show the continuity between the early and later texts. "Whitehead's metaphysics will present us with new language … of feeling and relation … mutual constitution and creativity … organicism and materialism … language … rich with developmental possibilities" (14).

By appealing to process thought, Pomeroy locates normativity within the most fundamental features of all things. To read Marx adequately requires upheaval at the level of metaphysics. "The metaphysical is itself the indictment" (195). Norms are not "outside reality." They do not arise from feelings projected by subjects onto objects; norms are not constructed; they are not planted on the subjective side of a subjective/object divide. The normative dimension goes to the core of reality; the critique of capital is generated by the tension between the dialectical process that underlies all reality and the undialectical form of capitalist production that impoverishes and distorts basic features of reality.

For example, to understand what's wrong with wage labor is to grasp the tension between the process of production--whereby individuals constitute both self and their world--and the fixed quantity or wage which is said to be the equal to this process. What is dead--the wage--in principle cannot measure living labor. "The exchange of a determination that is past for the human activity that is present(ed) is absolutely illegitimate" (120). Pomeroy calls this the "first injustice from which all the further injustices flow" (121). Capitalism violates the "original ontological incommensurability of persons and things" (122). To treat persons as objects exemplifies injustice.

In a similar way, the expropriation of surplus value separates persons from the newness or excess that marks their activity as "truly human." Pomeroy identifies the capitalist notion of "surplus" with the metaphysical category of "novelty." Human labor is treated as an object when stripped of this excess. The push to reduce necessary labor in order to expropriate a larger surplus robs persons of their inherent nature as creative. What constitutes the self and its world must belong to the self. Capitalism unleashes human creativity on a massive scale, but does not allow genuinely new possibilities to arise. "Present creativity sparked by future envisionment has been reduced to the abstract monetary expression of the generalized past labor of my brothers and sisters. Their creative lives have paid my wage and mine has paid theirs. We are the price of … one another's enslavement" (124). The necessity under capitalism to measure living labor in terms of the abstractions of value violates our fundamental human character. The category of value in the later Marx conveys with more precision the injustice expressed in the young Marx's account of alienation. Capitalism does not acknowledge human beings as free and creative, but simply compels labor to pump out surplus value. Persons--the origins of value--come to exist at the mercy of their products. "Value is really congealed labor--that is the life blood, the potential and real creativity of the human being hardened into mere physicality--into the not-human. Subjective creativity is the absolutely unique and free … activity of the individual, and capitalism requires that it be treated as what it is essentially not and traded off for this absolute other" (124).

Through Whitehead's lens, Pomeroy shows that capitalism is subject to critique because it is metaphysically deficient. Though capitalism cannot squelch metaphysical reality, a system founded on private property diminishes the "relational solidarity" of this world. The universe exists as process that constitutes each individual as unique. But capitalism harnesses creativity to sameness, the ongoing expansion of surplus value. Humans produce what is genuinely new, but "as capitalism operates, the world grinds toward stagnation" (146). Reality is dialectical--a whole constituted by interacting parts each of which matters--but under capitalism, reduction, separation, and abstraction take precedence over organic relations. Solidarity and relational continuity describe how things are. When capitalism splits apart nature, producers, owners, and consumers, it does not keep faith with what is. "Capitalism is a disaster for processive reality" (164). The volatility of capitalism originates in metaphysical disruption and leads continually to economic crisis and destruction of nature.

Understanding the differences between the thinkers is as important as appreciating their similarities. Overall, Pomeroy respects the distinctiveness of each thinker even as she coaxes real illumination from this unusual encounter of minds. She is rightfully uneasy with the duality that pervades Whitehead's thought. His dialectic situates opposed factors as simultaneous and belonging together; this philosophy of internal relations breaks through conceptual standoffs by stipulating unity. This "binding together into unity" differs from producing reconciliation through a process of thought. Neither Hegel nor Marx says much about the meaning of dialectic, except to reject any method that is treated as separable from the material. But in practice, their initial accounts develop from empty abstractions to more determinate or concrete concepts. The difference between Whitehead's philosophy of internal relations and Marx's immanent critique needs to be addressed more fully. For example, how does a philosophy of internal relations convey external relations, such as the externality of non-commodified human goods from market relations?

Pomeroy is most persuasive in showing how Whitehead's metaphysics corrects the rigid demarcations that distort our reading of Marx's texts; however, mapping metaphysical categories, such as creativity, on to capitalist forms, such as surplus labor, itself runs the risk of "misplaced concreteness." Necessary labor is no less creative than the labor designated for the expansion of surplus value. The differences between metaphysical generality and the specific forms of capitalism cannot always be bridged directly. Pomeroy responds well to the challenge of tailoring metaphysical categories to the specific focus of a critical theory of capitalism in identifying what is unique about human activity. Basic features of reality--such as the conceptual and physical poles or the creative decisions of actual entities--pertain to all entities. Pomeroy must adapt these general features of the world to the specific labor of persons. The differences between persons and the non-human world--such as reflection or freedom--are matters of degree but are suffused with importance.

One might wonder: can Whitehead succeed, where studies of Hegel failed, to elucidate the deep structure of Marx's thought? Does Whitehead's metaphysics improve our understanding of Marx's critical theory? Under Pomeroy's hand, these texts are engaged in a fruitful encounter. She moves between these demanding thinkers with persuasive readings that reveal the politics implicit in process thought and the sterility avoided by a conceptually richer approach to Marx. Pomeroy writes with passion and clarity. Her analysis doesn't disappear into the thicket of Whitehead's categories but stays focused on their political and economic implications. She argues in a splendid way how process thought anticipates new social relations. Her boldness is rewarded with a well-written text that sheds light on both thinkers, while addressing the tough issues raised by Marx's critique of capitalism.