Marx and Wittgenstein: Knowledge, Morality and Politics

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Kitching, Gavin and Pleasants, Nigel (eds.), Marx and Wittgenstein: Knowledge, Morality and Politics, Routledge, 2002, 320pp, $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415247756.

Reviewed by David G. Stern, University of Iowa


What, the reader of this review may well wonder, is the point of a collection of essays connecting Marx and Wittgenstein? After all, “it is possible to take almost any two thinkers of genuine insight and sophistication and to find some parallels and commonalities in their thought. Indeed, doing so is one of the favourite intellectual pastimes of all academics.” Indeed, one could legitimately ask whether “any two thinkers have less in common than Karl Marx and Ludwig Wittgenstein.” Consider, for a moment, the case for the prosecution. On the one hand we have Marx, political activist and economic theorist, the founder of the ’science’ of ’historical materialism,’ whose Theses on Feuerbach proclaim that “philosophers have only interpreted the world in various ways, the thing however is to change it.” On the other, Wittgenstein, a philosopher who “showed virtually no interest in conventional political activity,” famous for writing that “philosophy … leaves everything as it is” and who asked himself “who knows the laws by which society evolves?” only to answer “I am sure they are a closed book to the cleverest of men.”

Gavin Kitching’s excellent introduction to Marx and Wittgenstein not only anticipates and responds to these objections—all of the quotations in the previous paragraph are taken from his opening essay—but also provides a helpful orientation as to the range of approaches taken by the contributors to this volume. Kitching’s response to these objections is carefully measured. He sums up the point of the book in terms of three interrelated aims, aims that echo the Hegelian triad of thesis, antithesis, and synthesis. Kitching tells us that the book as a whole aims to show that (1) there are important commonalities in the thought of the two writers; (2) there are, nevertheless, important differences between Marx and Wittgenstein, and among Marxian Wittgensteinians; (3) yet a synthesis of Marx and Wittgenstein can be “mutually enriching” (pp. 2-3).

The principal historical connections lie partly in Wittgenstein’s sympathy for certain aspects of the left in the 1930s—he is said to have described himself as “a communist, at heart”—and partly in the question of the role that Pierro Sraffa’s Marxism might have played in his role as “stimulus for the most consequential ideas” of the Philosophical Investigations.1 The principal systematic commonalities lie in Marx’s and Wittgenstein’s rejection of the dualism of subject and object, observer and observed, and their turn toward human action or practice. The principal differences, as indicated above, have to do with the contrast between Wittgenstein’s opposition to scientism, and scepticism about a science of society, and the Marxist pursuit of such a science. Furthermore, the individual contributors disagree greatly about the possibility and desirability of a synthesis of Marx and Wittgenstein. I will return to the question how far the book realizes its editors’ aims after a brief survey of the individual contributions.

The fourteen essays are arranged into six parts, each bearing a title that sums up its contribution to the story mapped out in the Introduction. In Part I, “Conventional Wisdoms,” T. P. Uschanov reviews the reception history of Ernest Gellner’s polemical attack on Wittgenstein’s philosophy in general, and Gellner’s caricature of him as a covert political conservative, pursuing his political commitments under cover of philosophical impartiality, in particular. While Gellner’s critique, largely composed of shoddy rhetoric, insinuation and personal abuse, created considerable controversy, it was dismissed by the philosophical establishment at the time. However, his caricature of Wittgenstein was enormously attractive to those who needed a convenient rationale for dismissing him. It has since become conventional wisdom in many quarters, and especially among social scientists, and is certainly part of the reason why a relatively small number of social scientists on the left have taken a serious interest in Wittgenstein.

In Part II, “Commonalities,” four different ways of connecting the two thinkers are explored. Ted Schatzki approaches the connections between Marx and Wittgenstein by considering their conceptions of natural history; David Rubinstein looks at their understanding of culture and practical reason; David Andrews gives a Wittgenstein-influenced reading of Marx on commodity fetishism; and Terrell Carver discusses their relationship to postmodernism.

In Part III, “Wittgenstein and Sraffa,” Keiran Sharpe and John B. Davis, both experts on economics and philosophy, provide informative and complementary accounts of how Sraffa’s Marxism, and his particular approach to economics and questions of economic theory, could have influenced Wittgenstein’s work on the Philosophical Investigations. Sharpe sees the link in terms of the emphasis on the inter-relationship between social action, criteria, and context in Sraffa’s work, and the ways this would have led him to criticize the “asocial epistemology” (127) of the Tractatus. Davis highlights the parallels between Gramsci’s unveiling of hidden structures of power, Sraffa’s historicist critique of neo-classical economics, and Wittgenstein’s discussion of family resemblance, rule-following and practice. Sharpe, by dint of carefully assembling and arranging the available evidence, makes a surprisingly strong case for what must be a matter of conjecture; Davis makes the far stronger, and highly implausible, claim that Wittgenstein’s later ideas “presupposed the same philosophical posture of critique that Sraffa’s (and Gramsci’s) possessed” (142).

Part IV, “Disjunctions,” draws our attention to a leading area of disagreement among the contributors, concerning the nature of the relationship between the everyday use of language and social-scientific uses of language. In view of Peter Winch’s pivotal role in the debate over this topic, and his formative influence on most social scientists interested in Wittgenstein, it is appropriate that both Ted Benton, in “Wittgenstein, Winch and Marx,” and Nigel Pleasants in “Towards a critical use of Marx and Wittgenstein,” approach this issue by means of a discussion of Winch’s interpretation of Wittgenstein. Benton identifies a tension in Winch between the naturalistic tenor of most of his work and his commitment to the anti-naturalistic view that one cannot give a causal account of human action. His proposed resolution is to give up the anti-naturalism, a position that is justified by an appeal to “Wittgenstein’s naturalism.” Benton’s Wittgenstein has a conception of human nature that is a restatement of Marx’s: a Wittgenstein, like Rubinstein’s and Schatzki’s, made safe for a traditional sociological theory, by way of a reading of his philosophy as a theory of practice. Pleasants, on the other hand, like Fann, Kitching, Carver, and Read, contends that a construal of Wittgenstein as a practice theorist, a philosopher who put forward a theory of the social constitution of mind and meaning in order to undermine the methodological individualism of traditional philosophy, reproduces the very methodological errors Wittgenstein opposes. Pleasants’ Wittgenstein conceives of philosophy as an activity of clarification, one that brings about a change in the way we look at things but does not consist in the production of a theory of society or of practice: “what is to be avoided is the tendency—of both Wittgensteinians and Marxists—to automatically assume there must be an authentic ’Wittgensteinian’ or ’Marxist’ line on whatever engages their interest” (165).

Part V, “Forerunners,” complicates the relatively self-contained story told so far, as it draws connections with previous work on the Marx-Wittgenstein connection. The first published essay on Marx and Wittgenstein, Ferrucio Rossi-Landi’s rich and provocative “Towards a Marxian use of Wittgenstein,” originally published in Italian in 1966, is reprinted in a slightly shortened version. Joachim Israel’s “Remarks on Marxism and the philosophy of language” looks at the encounter between Wittgenstein and Marx within Marxist philosophy of language. He first considers Volosinov and Bakhtin as anticipators of Wittgenstein, then turns to a critique of Rossi-Landi’s reading of Wittgenstein, and ends by recommending Markus’ use of Wittgenstein in developing a contemporary Marxist philosophy of language.

Part VI, “Knowledge, morality and politics” reprises the subtitle of the book and promises the most direct engagement with the aim of showing how the encounter between Marx and Wittgenstein can be philosophically productive. Kitching’s “Marxism and reflectivity” approaches the question of whether Marxism is a science by way of a highly critical reading of Wright, Levine, and Sober’s Reconstructing Marxism. He identifies the leading failure of that book as a lack of reflexivity, the very reflexivity that Kitching identifies as central to both Marx’s and Wittgenstein’s approach to understanding practice. Read’s “Marx and Wittgenstein on vampires and parasites” draws parallels between Wittgenstein on the relationship between the language of everyday and philosophical language, and Marx’s account of exploitation in capitalism. Finally, Fann’s “Beyond Marx and Wittgenstein (A confession of a Wittgensteinian Marxist turned Taoist)” provides an apt autobiographical conclusion. It tells the story of his journey from postwar Taiwan to the US in search of a rational faith, his combination of Wittgenstein’s critique of metaphysics with Marxism-Leninism’s critique of capitalism, his proselytizing support for Mao’s Cultural Revolution, his rediscovery of Wittgenstein’s anti-scientism after the collapse of communism, and his Taoist rejection of Wittgenstein’s and Marx’s demanding ideals in favor of a life lived as an end in itself, not as a means to an end.

To what extent, then, will the book as a whole realize its editors’ hopes that bringing Marx and Wittgenstein together in this way will lead to an open, intense, and honest “dialogue both among and between Marxists and Wittgensteinians” (xv)? That depends, to a very large extent, on how one conceives of such a dialogue. Given the differences in outlook and loyalties separating most Marxists and most Wittgensteinians—the differences briefly summarized at the beginning of this review—it seems unlikely that this collection of attempts to forge links between Wittgenstein and Marxism will have any more impact on “dominant understandings of Marx or Wittgenstein” (Kitching, 11) than the surprisingly large number of previous attempts to do so, a tradition that already includes a number of books (Manser 1973, Rubinstein 1981, Easton 1983, Kitching 1988, Pleasants 1999) and many more journal articles.

However, that would be an overly narrow way to answer the question of the potential impact of this book. Pleasants provides a helpful framework here, distinguishing three broad kinds of attempts at relating Marx and Wittgenstein (161). First, there are accounts that try to show that Marx influenced Wittgenstein, either through Wittgenstein’s reading of specific texts of Marx, or via some intermediary. As Pleasants notes, these projects are a familiar, and fairly limited, kind of intellectual history. Furthermore, given the very scanty evidence, they will always seem speculative at best, wishful thinking at worst. Second, there are interpretations that argue for some similarity, or parallel, between certain aspects of their views, a “conventional scholarly exercise in textual interpretation and theoretical construction” (161). The principal problem with this approach, as T. E. Wilkerson unkindly but pithily observes in his review of another “Wittgenstein and … “ project, is that “any two philosophers are similar in some respect, but there is often little profit in dwelling on the similarity.”2

Third, there are writers who go further afield than the historians and the drawers of similarities. Typically, they use methods or ideas derived from one thinker to reconstruct the other, or draw on both for social and political criticism. It is this project—making use of Marx and Wittgenstein, rather than interpreting them—that is encapsulated in the epigraph to Rossi-Landi’s contribution: “Do not seek for the meaning of a philosopher, seek for his use: the meaning of a philosopher is his use in the culture.” (Pleasants, 161; Rossi-Landi, 185) These parts of this collection, those that go beyond the letter of what Marx and Wittgenstein had to say, are the ones that have the greatest promise and will hold the most interest for a readership extending beyond those specializing in Marx and Wittgenstein. Indeed, the particular topics discussed in this book are connected with a number of broader currents of contemporary thought. For there is a renewed interest at present in bringing together Wittgenstein’s contribution to a critique of traditional philosophy, and his emphasis on bringing words home to their ordinary uses, on the one hand, and a radical, or liberatory, ethics and politics, on the other. Three collections of new essays that exemplify these developments are The Legacy of Wittgenstein: Pragmatism or Deconstruction (ed. Ludwig Nagl and Chantal Mouffe; Peter Lang, 2001); Slow Cures and Bad Philosophers: Essays on Wittgenstein, Medicine and Bioethics (ed. Carl Elliott; Duke University Press, 2001) and Feminist Interpretations of Ludwig Wittgenstein (ed. Naomi Scheman and Peg O’Connor; Pennsylvania State University Press, 2002).

Furthermore, there is a strikingly autobiographical dimension to many of the essays in this collection; taken together, they cast light on the Nietzschean idea that “philosophy is always autobiography” (Fann, 282). In contrast to most professional philosophy, which aspires to read as if written from nowhere, many contributors tell us about the relationship between their professional and personal lives and the ideas they discuss. Carver’s insightful essay draws our attention to the need that readers have to construct an authorial persona when reading Wittgenstein or Marx, a characterization of the “who, when and why of writing it,” in order to understand what the author wrote. Carver notes that we do not only have to be able to tell a story about what motivated Marx and Wittgenstein in order to interpret what they wrote. The same point about emplotment “certainly applies to the way that interpretations of texts by Marx and Wittgenstein are constructed by commentators … Readers thus have the job of learning about commentators as authors when reading their texts, as well as learning about Marx and Wittgenstein when reading theirs” (96). Similarly, we readers of Marx and Wittgenstein have the job of learning about the contributors to the volume as authors when reading their texts. One of the pleasures of this book is the willingness of a number of authors to tell us about how their personal, political, and philosophical lives are related. Part of what we learn from their autobiographical stories is the moral seriousness of their interpretations of Marx and Wittgenstein: the sense of elation felt on discovering that they could reconcile certain views, or their distress at finding that certain aspects of one or the other’s thought had to be rejected. We also learn that the most interesting connections between Marx and Wittgenstein that the book draws are neither historical connections between those two figures, nor systematic parallels between their thought, but rather the connections that have been forged by their readers.


1. Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, Preface. Ray Monk reports that Wittgenstein once told Rowland Hutt: “I am a communist, at heart” (Monk, Ludwig Wittgenstein: The Duty of Genius, p. 343. New York, Macmillan, 1990.)

2. T. E. Wilkerson, review of Russell Goodman’s Wittgenstein and William James, Mind 2003, p. 346. I should add that I do not agree with Wilkerson’s harsh assessment of Goodman’s book.