Mary Astell: Theorist of Freedom from Domination

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Patricia Springborg, Mary Astell: Theorist of Freedom from Domination, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 372pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521841047.

Reviewed by E. Derek Taylor, Longwood University


Early in her introduction, Patricia Springborg alerts her readers to a deflating fact: Mary Astell: Theorist of Freedom from Domination is not, it turns out, a "new" book on Astell by a foremost scholar of her life and writing, but rather an enhanced compilation of previously published essay-length studies written by Springborg over the past two decades. "I make no apology," the author explains, "for the fact that much of the material this book contains appeared in articles and book chapters"; gathering these publications together, in her estimation, allows "a coherent overall assessment of Astell" (p. 2). It would be more accurate to say that the collection allows for an overall assessment of Springborg's considerable contributions to the study of an early-modern figure whose full contours we have yet fully to flesh out.

Nowhere is Springborg sharper, her argument clearer, than in her retrospective, at times introspective, introduction. Here she gracefully articulates and defends her two major theses: 1.) Astell was at once a High Church Tory and a feminist; and 2.) Astell's "work belongs in an important way to the reception of Locke" (p. 3). Literary scholars in particular have regularly bemoaned Astell's ostensibly self-defeating dual allegiances to the cause of female empowerment, on the one hand, and to the deeply conservative politics of the Anglican establishment, on the other. But this, Springborg insists, "is a problem falsely posed," one that "bespeaks progressivist assumptions about a 'proper' feminism that are anachronistic when applied to seventeenth-century women" (p. 3). Having herself formerly "referred to Astell mostly as a proto-feminist," Springborg now believes that she "was wrong to do so" (p. 6). Indeed, there is good reason, she maintains, to think that the sort of "relentless pressure" exerted by Astell and other Tory feminists -- an apt label that deserves to gain currency -- cleared the ground, thereby making the eventual "conjunction of Whig progressivism and feminism possible" (p. 10).

Springborg's second main point, as elaborated in her introduction, is in constant and generally productive service to her first. Those critics who have wished Astell better to resemble latter-day feminists, she notes, often have done so by playing fast and loose with her political leanings. Several have posited, for instance, her cordial admiration for John Locke. But Astell's disdain for Locke and for his political, philosophical, and theological positions, Springborg rightly insists, is everywhere apparent in her later works. And to those who would disqualify Astell from the feminist fold because her Tory pen attacked with such vehemence Locke's Whiggish progressivism, Springborg sagely demonstrates that in demystifying the implications of contractarianism for women, Astell reveals herself not as outdated, but as proleptic. Along with Judith Drake, another Tory feminist, Astell ought to be credited with recognizing so readily "the Achilles heel of the marriage contract-social contract analogue as first made by Hobbes and Locke" (p. 25).

Moving from the introduction to the inconsistent chapters that follow leaves one wishing for nothing so much as the book-length study the title page had seemed to promise. At its best, Springborg's collection provides a refreshingly authentic, unsanitized picture of Astell as an intellectually complicated figure who deserves consideration beyond her incisive critique of marriage. Springborg is always careful to stress the difference between Astell as her modern audience might wish her to have been and Astell as she was -- i.e., as someone who animadverted against "freedom of belief and freedom of the press" (p. 129); who advocated the "dismal" concept of passive obedience (p. 135); who explicitly accepted the husband's prerogative once the wedding ceremony ended; who embraced "the losing side" of the theosophical debate between John Norris of Bemerton and Locke (p. 48). Nor does Springborg allow readers to forget that Astell was a willing participant in vicious debates over the practical political issues of her day. The same thinker "who could ascend to the heights of ecstatic Platonism" in such works as Letters Concerning the Love of God (1695) was also "quite capable of competing in the Grub Street gutter press" (p. 35).

As with any book, there are missteps, some relatively minor. An entire section on Damaris, Lady Masham seems rather beside the point and, worse, relies on special pleading. Masham's "well-reasoned response" to Norris and Astell in her Discourse Concerning the Love of God (1696), readers are told, "is devastating." She strikes a "cruel blow" to their Platonism. Her accusation of self-refutation against Norris is (again) "devastating." She delivers a "master stroke" in accusing Malebranche of irreverence. Her argument "by no means suggests a mere acolyte of Locke." The evidence here supplied suggests that the contrary to each of these assertions is, at the very least, plausible. In a somewhat similar vein, it is disappointing to see Nicolas Malebranche's musings about a link between gender and intelligence again adduced as grounds for Astell's hypothetical rejection of him (p. 65) -- especially since, in reality, Astell herself appears never to have been bothered by the oft-cited passage. On pp. 21-22 of the Springborg editon of Astell's Some Reflections Upon Marriage (Cambridge, 1996), it is worth noting, Astell celebrates Malebranche ("an extraordinary Genius") as a supporter of the intellectual capacities of women.

One misstep is so pronounced, and so frequently made, as to warrant special mention here. It is with no little puzzlement and consternation that one attempts to struggle through Springborg's legion articulations of her claim that Astell's publishing career is defined by her constant engagement with Locke. On this point, Springborg is not only unconvincing but, at times, downright sloppy. Simply put, there is no evidence that Astell has particular interest in Locke, much less that she bears him hostility, until after her publication of A Serious Proposal to the Ladies, Part II (1697). In Springborg's extended account of and frequent references to this text, however, Locke inexplicably becomes not only Astell's target -- already a debatable assumption -- but Astell's main target. To make this unsustainable connection requires a host of tortuous readings; it is difficult to overstate just how overstated Springborg's analysis is on this point. For the purposes of this review, the following representative example of Springborg's reading of an ostensible "attack" on Locke must suffice:

In A Serious Proposal, Part II, Chapter 2, Astell sets out her own programme for freedom: a disengagement from prejudice, opinion of names, authorities and customs that

[c]ontract our Souls and shorten our views, hinder the free range of our Thoughts and confine them only to that particular track which these have taken, and in a word, erect a Tyranny over our free born Souls, whilst they suffer nothing to pass for True that has not been stampt at their own Mint.

Once again, the apparent contradiction of her claim to dismantle a tyranny over 'free born Souls' is a function of irony, and once again, the target is Locke. We are cued by the long and convoluted argument that follows, beginning, 'But this is not all their mischief, they are really the root of Scepticism'. Astell claims that the weakness of Locke's original knowledge claims makes it imperative to draw false inferences to arrive at a predictable result, which is to claim certainty for nothing, that everything is probable and, in the end, believe nothing at all. (p. 100)

There is, in fact, not a whiff of irony here, and not a hint of Locke; note that by the end the claims being made about the quotation bear no relation to it. But by planting Locke's name at every possible turn -- it appears no less than five times on this page alone -- Springborg manages to create an association between unrelated ideas, a logical fallacy that Locke, for his part, well understood.

When Spingborg's generally sensitive ear goes tone deaf, Locke is surely near -- or, as the case may be, not near. Indeed, not only does Springborg see Locke where he is not; she also (and this truly is ironic) misses him where he is. In her conclusion to Chapter 2, for instance, Springborg writes the following sentence in reference to Astell's actual attack on Locke in her The Christian Religion (1705):

Astell proposes to 'stick to [her] Assertion, that GOD if He pleases can superadd Excellencies' or qualities, even though humans discriminate between distinct ideas on the basis of one quality / one entity. (p. 112)

Unfortunately, Springborg appears not to recognize that the italicized words are directly quoted from Locke's third response to Bishop Worcester (1699); the "Assertion" is precisely not "hers," but rather her witty parody of Locke's materialist proposition in Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1690) that God could, without logical contradiction, add to matter such "Excellencies" as the ability to think -- an absurdity, from Astell's perspective, analogous to supposing He could add the ability to speak to the idea of a triangle without vitiating its essence. Springborg's account thus leaves readers with an utterly backwards understanding of Astell's extensive, and carefully satiric, argument.

In her introduction, Springborg provides excerpts of complaints from her "most critical reader," who, in his/her reader's report, concludes that Springborg's claims for Astell's connection to Locke are "hugely inflated and unsustainable" (p. 3). I am not this reader, but I find it difficult to disagree. More importantly, it must be noted that the criticisms I am here offering can hardly come as a surprise to Springborg, who has already hesitantly acknowledged (albeit in a footnote) her tendency to read Locke into Astell's mind sooner and more directly than the evidence supports: "I accept Taylor's criticism that I have perhaps been too ready to read A Serious Proposal, Part II, as a full-scale attack on Locke when there is still some ambivalence on Astell's part" (p. 275). How are readers to reconcile this admission with the contrary assertion that this is the text in which "Astell undertakes her first spirited rebuttal of Locke" (p. 92)? How can Locke emerge in this text as the direct object of Astell's "detest[ation]" (p. 165) if, as Springborg now admits, her one direct reference to him is commendatory (p. 275)? How can Astell demonstrate a "career-long hostility to Locke" (p. 165), or undertake a "systematic rebuttal of Locke … throughout her corpus" (p. 203), if the three earliest of her six major works afford him no animus and little, if any, interest?

Which brings us back to the opening problem. As a compilation, Springborg's book forces to the surface any and all inconsistencies, some small, some large, several of which she herself appears eager to qualify. It is perhaps asking too much to wonder why the editors at Cambridge did not insist on as much. As it stands, the advice John Norris offered Elizabeth Thomas (circa 1700) respecting Locke's Essay may be usefully applied to Springborg's collection: It "is a Book you should read, and may with great Advantage … [but] it must be with due Caution and Circumspection."